Jean-Luc Nancy

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Marie-Eve Morin, Jean-Luc Nancy, Polity, 2012, 224pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745652412.

Reviewed by Christopher Watkin, Monash University


Claiming to be "the first comprehensive and systematic account of Nancy's thinking, all the way up to his most recent work on the deconstruction of Christianity", this book is a very fine introduction to Nancy for advanced undergraduate and research students. Although it becomes rather dense for an introduction in places -- largely out of a desire to remain close to Nancy's own idiom -- its coverage is wide, its context deep and its pace lively.

At 151 pages excluding notes, bibliography and index, Marie-Eve Morin's introduction breaks down Nancy's thought into five main chapters covering ontology, Christianity, community, politics and a final chapter dealing with the body and art. One of the main tightropes a book like this has to walk is trying to provide a guiding idea, or a thesis, in terms of which to approach Nancy's work as a whole, given that his own thought is explicitly resistant to such an approach. Morin is sensitive to this difficulty in the way in which she offers the singular plural as a guiding motif in Nancy's thought:

In a sense, the "singular plural" furnishes the "axiom" of Nancy's thought, from which everything else follows. Yet it is also this "axiom" that undermines all attempts at finding any "wholeness" or "systematicity" in his thought. Cursorily said, the singular plural means that there are singularities whose identity or selfhood can only be found in their "relation" to other singularities: what exists finds itself in being exposed to or being in contact with other singularities in such a way that nothing exists or makes sense on its own. (p. 2)

We might quibble about the appropriateness of evoking axioms in relation to Nancy's thought, but the idea of setting up the singular plural as the guiding thread works well in finding a way through Nancy's intentionally fragmented corpus that does not force unwarranted homologies across his different engagements but nevertheless allows repeated patterns and movements to emerge. This yields a structure to Morin's book that is somewhat analogous to her construction of Nancy's own thought, in which "sentences and propositions do not build on each other accord­ing to some sort of geometric or syllogistic method" but rather

his books or his essays tend to be circular, each section presenting the 'same' point, reiterated each time from a different perspective, with a different emphasis or in relation to a different thinker, in such a way that each section sheds a bit more light on the issue in question. (p. 2)

Given that the chapters are structured thematically rather than chronologically, the introduction includes a fast-paced chronological précis of Nancy's early work as the reader is taken on a joy ride past The Title of the Letter (p. 8), Logodaedalus (p. 9), The Speculative Remark (p. 10), The Literary Absolute (p. 10), and Ego Sum (p. 12), and is left feeling exhilarated and dizzy in equal measure. This rapid-fire introduction could be forbidding for anyone not already acquainted with Nancy and his philosophical milieu.

The first main chapter on ontology "presents all of the main concepts of Nancy's work" (p. 21), mainly through a discussion of Being Singular Plural. The idea of "main concepts" rubs up somewhat against the later claim that the coherence in Nancy's corpus comes through mutual exposition of fragments rather than overarching categories. But even if we have to throw away this conceptual ladder by the end of the book, it is well used at this early stage to let the reader who is new to Nancy gain a foothold early on. The resistance to overarching ideas never disappears altogether, as we see in the hesitating assertion that

In a sense, the four chap­ters that follow the first draw on the consequences of Nancy's thinking of being or existence to develop a thinking of monothe­ism, God, and the Christian mysteries (chapter 2), a thinking of community (chapter 3), a thinking of politics, sovereignty and democracy (chapter 4) and a thinking of matter, body and art (chapter 5). (p. 21, emphasis added)

For an introductory volume of this length, Morin's book grapples well with the resistance to systematicity in Nancy's fragmentary approach.

The structure of the first chapter is also well worked out, delaying the introduction of the key term "being singular plural" until the groundwork has properly been laid, so as to "forestall any curtailed understanding of the singular plural as some sort of banal expression of the multiplicity of particular things" (p. 36). This strategy serves to freshen up this key Nancean term for those already familiar with his work, foregrounding the set of questions to which it is a response. It should also help those new to Nancy to gain a more adequate grasp of this important notion. In addition, Morin very helpfully draws the reader's attention in this chapter to the important and often misunderstood point that for Nancy the finite is not in opposition to the absolute and the infinite. Here and elsewhere the readings offered of Nancy's work are sure-footed and nuanced.

Morin is not afraid regularly to leave Nancy aside for a couple of pages and lay out directly the thought of one of the thinkers with whom he engages. This practice of detour may initially be confusing for readers unfamiliar with the extent to which much recent French thought progresses through the close reading of philosophical predecessors, but it is those same readers who will soon find the detours one of the most helpful features of the book. This said, they can be even more break-neck than the treatment of Nancy himself. In the first chapter, for example, we are treated to a thumbnail sketch of Heidegger's Being and Time (!) that rattles through the "analytic of Dasein", "ownness", "thrownness", "fallenness", "the 'they'", "disclosedness", "resoluteness" and "anxiety" within the space of two pages.

After the foundational chapter on ontology, Morin moves to a discussion of Nancy's engagement with Christianity. One of this book's great strengths is that it gives full weight to this key aspect of Nancy's thought, as well as to the way in which his reading of the West's Christian and monotheistic heritage shapes his work in other areas. One advantage of a thematic over a chronological treatment is that the chapter on Christianity can come before that on community, and indeed the decision to place the discussion of Christianity directly after the foundational chapter on ontology may in part be intended to resist the framing of Nancy as primarily a thinker of community, a narrowness which has plagued his reception until recently.

Regardless of whether the decision had such a strategic aim, it makes a lot of sense in terms of the logic of the book's exposition because, as Morin rightly claims, Nancy's engagement with Christianity is "integral to the ontological categories that have been laid out" in the first chapter (p. 47): It is the withdrawal of the gods that leads to the birth of community (p. 51). In a way reminiscent of the whistle-stop tour of Being and Time in the opening chapter, here we have a brief sketch of onto-theology (p. 57) suitable for those who are hearing the term for the first time.

This sort of ground-up briefing, repeated often throughout the book, means that it is genuinely a book for the "general reader" as the series preface claims, providing that reader is willing to travel through Nancy's work in fifth gear. The relatively ample space accorded in this chapter to the slender Noli me tangere, at the relative expense of the longer Adoration, reflects Morin's concern with the primacy of Nancy's relation to Derrida and therefore his engagement with the haptic. Both the blurb and the book claim to be distancing Nancy from Derrida, but on occasion it seems as though Nancy is being read through Derrida rather than alongside him.

I have a minor disagreement with Morin's presentation of the deconstruction of Christianity. Although it is not wrong to stress that "deconstruction is essentially Christian" and that the struggle against nihilism "requires a certain retrieval of notions internal to Christianity" (p. 58), it is important also to mention that it is not Christianity per se which is crucial for Nancy but what in Being Singular Plural he characterises as something in Christianity deeper than Christianity itself, a demand to which Christianity is one response: the demand of singular plural being. In other words, though deconstruction in the West is inseparable from its Christian heritage, for Nancy it is not fundamentally Christian.

The third chapter on community is very helpful for anyone new to Nancy in the way in which it tells the story of his exchanges with Blanchot in the early 1980s. Considerable space is also accorded to a sketch of Bataille's understanding of community in relation to the unworked or inoperative (sans emploi). The main point of the chapter on politics is to examine the relation between Nancy's politics and his ontology, namely "that Nancy's ontological description is also an imperative: we are in-common, we are world-forming, yet we must be or become what we are" (p. 96). Just why this "must" follows from this "are" is not dealt with, and Nancy's ontological communism is only very briefly mentioned. The chapter focuses instead on the withdrawal of the political, totalitarianism and ecotechnics. In reading the chapter it is easy to miss what is at stake in the crucial difference between "politics" and "the political" for Nancy, and although the difference is briefly evoked, the terms could be more clearly differentiated. Despite this, the readings here as elsewhere are generally careful and fresh.

The final chapter is entitled "From Body to Art". Why treat body and art together in one chapter? Because they both have to do with dualism: "The link is obvious as soon as we recall that Hegel defines art as 'the sensuous presentation of the Idea'" (p. 124). This chapter is particularly rich in illuminating detours via Descartes' Meditations, Hegel on art as the presentation of the idea, and Heidegger on art as the poetising of truth. The main argument is that, whereas both Hegel and Heidegger seek to subsume the different arts in one way or another under an overarching category of "art", Nancy understands them in terms of a non-totalizable mutual exposition in which "art" is not the set of which all the arts are members but that which "happens at the interstice between all of them" (p. 147).

The four page conclusion draws the reader back to the "centre" of Nancy's thought where we find selfhood as difference, "a rift that inscribes an inappropriable exteriority at the 'heart' of any self" and that "informs all of the central concepts of Nancy's ontology: finitude, sense, sharing, world, freedom" (p. 149). Morin does a good job of drawing links between the different chapters without forcing them, but the book could be strengthened by highlighting more of these resonances across chapters. It might have been helpful to link the discussion of communism and liberalism back to the way Nancy thinks about the difference between fundamentalism and globalization, for example. Morin also introduces terms of her own that further strengthen the coherence of her analysis across chapters and help to the reader to discern repeated movements of Nancean thought, like the "'two-world' paradigm" of metaphysics. The book has an index and an excellently accessible bibliography, helpfully categorized in a way that allows the student to find her way directly to some of the key secondary material on particular questions or aspects of Nancy's thought.

Overall, the treatment of Nancy's texts remains close to his writing and draws on plenty of direct quotation, allowing the reader to gain some sense of his characteristic idiom. On occasion there is a risk of sticking too close to Nancy's style, leaving the "interested general reader" struggling to keep up. Nevertheless, as Morin rightly says "these texts cannot be summarized, but must be read. Only such a reading can give rise to the experience of the extremity of language, where 'language loses itself' in shattering itself against materiality. No commentary can capture this experience" (p. 125). The other main difficulty for any English language introduction to Nancy is the complex work done by particular French terms with plural and/or ambiguous meanings. Morin does a good job of spotting and explaining such terms when they come up (Nancean exposition and the idea of the retrait (withdrawal) of politics are two good examples, along with the old chestnut of Derridean différance), whereas the plural meanings of the crucial term sens (sense) are listed only in a footnote. Despite a very brief evocation of Badiou and Rancière in relation to Nancy's thinking on politics the reader is given little sense of how Nancy's work relates to other key contemporary thinkers. Even if the nature of this book does not allow a chapter-length treatment of Nancy's reception, some more brief sketches would have been welcome.

To date, the primary introduction to Nancy's thought has been Ian James's The Fragmentary Demand. In the seven years since the appearance of James' introduction Nancy's thought has developed, notably through the publication of the second volume of his Deconstruction of Christianity in 2010. Morin's book is shorter than James's by 100 pages, indicating that the two volumes have in mind different audiences. I fully expect that in the future they will stand side by side as valuable complementary introductions to Nancy. The Polity Key Contemporary Thinkers series to which this volume belongs seeks to "make available to a wide audience the ideas of some of the most influential thinkers of our time". Morin's volume achieves this aim well, in large part due to the way in which she is careful to take time in setting Nancy's thought in the context of those philosophers with whom he engages, as well as providing nuanced but accessible treatments of Nancy's corpus, with no obvious gaps. As one of the most wide-ranging and genuinely innovative thinkers in any tradition alive today Nancy certainly deserves an up-to-date introduction to a wide and general readership. Thanks to Morin we can now say that he has the introduction he deserves.