Jean-Paul Sartre: Key Concepts

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Steven Churchill and Jack Reynolds (eds.), Jean-Paul Sartre: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2013, 244pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844656356.

Reviewed by Arsalan Memon, Lewis University


This is a collection of scrupulously written essays by contemporary Sartre scholars seeking to explain, as the title suggests, Sartre's fundamental concepts. The volume is divided into three parts -- Part I: Psychology, Psychoanalysis and Literature, Part II: Ontology: Freedom, Authenticity and Self-Creation, and Part III: Ethics and Politics. The three parts roughly correspond to Sartre's early, middle, and late periods, respectively. The book contains nineteen essays. Each stands alone even if each of them builds off of the previous essay. There is some overlap among the essays, but that is inevitable given the interconnectedness of Sartre's concepts. The aim of the book is "to make Sartre's broader body of work accessible to a wider audience" (3). Some essays emphasize depth over breadth whereas others stress breadth over depth. Admittedly, it may have not been easy to balance depth and breadth, especially given the book's aim. Taken as a whole, the book achieves its aim and is a valuable, accessible, reliable guide for advanced undergraduates, graduate students, non-Sartrean scholars, and Sartre experts. My only overall complaint is that most authors could have been more critical of Sartre. First-time readers of Sartre would have benefited from that.

Steven Churchill and Jack Reynolds open with a succinct and lucid introduction. They argue that Sartre is very much alive, and this is evidenced by the fact that the "totality" of his works have not yet been fully explored or understood, which the present volume precisely seeks to do in a modest way (2). Next, Gary Cox discusses Sartre's life. He debunks certain myths about Sartre. For example, contrary to popular belief, Sartre was not a drug user (7). Overall, Cox does a fine job in showing how Sartre's life informed and transformed his works and vice versa.

The first philosophical essay is written by Beata Stawarska. She evaluates Sartre's proximity to and distance from Husserl on notions such as intentionality, phenomenological method, transcendental ego, imagination, and emotions (12-31). The sections on how Sartre was introduced to and influenced by Husserl contain meticulous details (13-18). In discussing Sartre's relation to Husserl, Stawarska limits her reading to Husserl's Ideas I. In Transcendence of the Ego, Sartre criticizes the so-called Kantian inspired transcendental ego found in Husserl's Ideas I (19-24). Stawarska does not question the accuracy of Sartre's reading of Husserl (19-24). This criticism also applies to the essays written by Christian Onof, Churchill, and Betty Cannon (see specifically 34-35, 55-60, 81, respectively). Novices may take this reading to be an accurate portrayal of Husserl's position. In §57 of Ideas I, Husserl approvingly cites Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, but he also cautions the reader to take this claim in a "preliminary" way. Husserl's transcendental ego is an ego whose self-identity is affected by and sustained through time and, thus, is not like Kant's formal ego.[1]

Onof follows the development of Sartre's account of the self from The Transcendence of the Ego to Being and Nothingness. He interprets Sartre as a "direct realist" in the sense of denying any mediation of mental content between consciousness and things (33). Onof thoroughly examines how in Being and Nothingness Sartre further develops the concept of the self from Transcendence of the Ego (36-43). Onof's examination centers on the different distinctions Sartre employs in defining consciousness: positional/non-positional, non-reflective/reflective/pre-reflective, and thetic/non-thetic (35-39). The distinctions need further clarification, otherwise those new to the topic would be confused by such distinctions. Such readers should consult Thomas Busch's clarification of these terms (166).

In a well-written essay, Churchill makes the case for why the pre-war Sartre must also be read as being engaged in and with the world (44-64). Although this is not a criticism, the reader should consult the conclusion before reading the entire essay because in the conclusion Churchill aptly summarizes the entire essay in a step-by-step fashion (64). Adrian van den Hoven approaches Sartre's novels and plays by paying close attention to different moments in Sartre's life and to specific political events that inspired him to write on particular themes (66-75).

Cannon compares and contrasts Sartre's existential psychoanalysis and Freud's psychoanalysis. The section on Freud is quite complicated, at least for non-experts (77-80). One explanation may be that Freud's psychoanalytical vocabulary does not lend itself to being explained in three pages. The sections on Sartre are clearer than the section on Freud (80-89). However, given that the sections on Sartre rely on the section on Freud at least to the extent of understanding the similarities and differences between the two figures, some basic familiarity with Freud's terminology is required. At the end of her essay, Cannon suggests that Sartre's existential psychoanalysis has a lot to offer to contemporary, post-Freudian psychoanalysts and psychotherapists. In addition, Sartre's existential psychoanalysis can also be seen as an alternative to the psychoanalytic and psychotherapeutic approaches inspired by Ludwig Binswanger, Heidegger, and Medard Boss.

Sarah Richmond puts forth an ontological interpretation of Sartre's notion of nothingness as it is presented in Being and Nothingness. Throughout the essay, she does not clarify what is meant by ontological. Richmond concedes at one point that Sartre's notion of nothingness is difficult to understand (100). At times, she does not write accessibly. For instance, she writes, "Sartre concludes that there must be some being that in some way 'is' its own nothingness" (99). Such sentences will definitely confuse new readers of Sartre. Richmond mentions at least two strong objections that traditionally have been raised against Sartre: 1) Sartre violates the law of non-contradiction (100) and 2) like Carnap's criticism of Heidegger's "das Nichts," Ayer contends that Sartre's notion of nothingness is nonsensical because nothingness is treated as if it were something (98-101). It is not entirely clear if Richmond provides an adequate response to these two criticisms. She critically assesses the inadequacies of some responses to both criticisms (102-04). She raises some interesting critical objections against Sartre's notion of nothingness (103-04). At the end of the essay, she highlights the significance of Sartre's notion of nothingness for contemporary philosophy: it can account for the "ontology of fictional entities, impossible objects (like the round square), and the objects referred to in statements of their non-existence" (105).

Søren Overgaard seeks to show that Sartre's concept of being-for-others in Being and Nothingness can account for the encounter with the other in a more adequate way than Husserl's position on intersubjectivity from the Cartesian Meditations and Heidegger's account of Mitsein (being-with) from Being and Time. Overgaard's main argument is that unlike Husserl and Heidegger, Sartre avoids solipsism and establishes the self-other relationship in such a way where the other is encountered as a subject and not merely as an object, especially in the looking-looked relation (112-14). Overgaard makes no mention of the role that empathy (Einfühlung) plays in Husserl's arguments on intersubjectivity from the Cartesian Meditations. It is arguable that through the concept of empathy Husserl can also demonstrate the possibility of encountering the other as a subject.

David Detmer's essay is exceptionally clear. Detmer defines Sartre's concept of bad faith as "attempts to evade the truth and to keep it hidden from oneself" (118). Although this is a minor concern, it would have been helpful to define what Sartre means by truth and to explain which theory of truth (if any) Sartre incorporates in his discussion of bad faith (e.g., correspondence, coherence, pragmatic, unconcealment [aletheia], etc). This would have been useful to those who are interested in Sartre's theory of truth. He evaluates how bad faith works by exploiting certain dualities, including: 1) facticity/transcendence, 2) past/future, 3) thetic/non-thetic awareness, and 4) pre-reflective/reflective consciousness (122-26). Jonathan Webber seeks to defend Sartre's notion of authenticity against the one advocated by Charles Larmore in The Practices of the Self (131-42). Webber's essay complements Detmer's because authenticity is contrasted with bad faith in Sartre's works.

Anthony Hatzimoysis expounds Sartre's description of knowledge as intuitive knowledge, which is found in a very short section of Being and Nothingness, "Knowledge as a Type of Relation Between the For-Itself and the In-Itself". For Sartre, consciousness's presence to things is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for knowing something (147-48). Hatzimoysis raises some serious objections against Sartre's epistemology (150). I would add the following objection: if, for Sartre, intuition is the sole source for justification of our epistemic claims, and intuition is opposed to discourse (146, cf. 150), then is Sartre arguing for some sort of notion of the Given? If so, is Sartre guilty of appealing to what Sellars calls the "Myth of the Given"?[2] Anyone interested in Sartre's epistemology should be concerned about this question.

Paul Crittenden discusses Sartre's key concept of project in its relation to freedom (152-62). This essay supplements Cannon's because Crittenden discusses how the first stage in Sartre's existential psychoanalysis is to uncover each individual's fundamental project (160). Thomas Busch surveys the evolution of Sartre's notion of freedom -- from Being and Nothingness to the Critique of Dialectical Reason -- vis-à-vis Sartre's "turn to politics" through self-making and alienation. According to Busch, what we find in Sartre's Critique is a dialectical relation between one's freedom and one's situation where the situation limits one's freedom (171). Without going into details, Busch's reading of the early Sartre can be challenged. In Being and Nothingness, Sartre explicitly states, "there is freedom only in a situation, and there is a situation only through freedom".[3] Here I would only point out that there is an ambiguity with respect to Sartre's position on freedom in Being and Nothingness: is it unconditioned freedom or situated freedom? It is precisely because of this ambiguity that Merleau-Ponty advised Sartre to explicitly "elaborate a theory of passivity".[4]

William L. McBride provides a remarkable account of Sartre as a politically engaged activist (173-83). Peter Caws faces the challenging task of clarifying Sartre's theory of groups from the first volume of the Critique of Dialectical Reason. He explains some of Sartre's difficult terminology from the Critique better than Sartre himself. This is no easy task. He lucidly analyzes the "ascent" from the insular individual to the collective humanity, the role that history plays in group formation, and the lack of totalization of history. Caws describes the process of group formation through the notion of "emergence" (191-92). He could have further developed this point by fleshing out the kind of emergentism that he discovers in Sartre's theory of group formation.

Thomas C. Anderson's essay is another highlight. It is very well-argued. Of all the authors in the book, Anderson is by far the most critical of Sartre. He constructs an intriguing view of Sartre's first two ethics, the ethics of authenticity and the dialectical ethics. According to Anderson, the goal of the ethics of authenticity is freedom, whereas the goal of the dialectical ethics is the fulfillment of human needs (200). Anderson meticulously argues that the different ethics are based on different ontologies and, thus, have different sources for human values (198). In the first ethics, values are subjective and, in the second ethics, some values are objective (198-9). This is one of the reasons why he contends that the second ethics is superior to the first ethics. There are other problems with the first ethics (196, 199-200, 202, 204). One thing that remains unclear in his discussion of Sartre's second ethics is: are all needs equally important? This is a relevant question because if there is a hierarchy of needs ranking from more to less important, then there would be a way to discern their respective values. Anderson states that the "very fact that our needs demand to be satisfied makes their satisfaction our primary value and goal" (202). If this is a correct interpretation of Sartre's dialectical ethics, then does Sartre commit the is/ought fallacy? That is, does Sartre derive an ought (i.e., we ought to satisfy our needs) from an is (i.e., human organisms have needs)? This question would be of interest to those studying or working on Sartre's ethics.

Marguerite La Caze carefully reconstructs Sartre's third ethics, or the ethics of reciprocity, that we find in Sartre's last interview, Hope Now. La Caze emphasizes that the third ethics is quite controversial because it seems that the interview is not really about Sartre's position but more about Benny Lévy's position, Sartre's secretary (206). For that very reason, LaCaze exclusively focuses on Sartre's responses. La Caze claims that Sartre's last ethics is continuous with his other two ethics in some respects, but it is fundamentally different from his other two ethics. This is because it is based on neither conflict nor need, but on helping each other out, especially those who are in need (209, cf. 206). She also expounds Sartre's concepts of fraternity, direct democracy, and non-religious Messianism based on the hope of a better future to come (209-12). La Caze could have been critical of Sartre on some points. For instance, she says that, for Sartre, this future state to come is a different ethical state than the present one, a state which would be related to generosity, justice and trust (211). What does Sartre mean by such terms? Would Sartre be able to solve the following moral dilemma: if there are two equally needy people, how do we decide who gets our help? From La Caze's exposition of Sartre's ethics of reciprocity, such questions cannot be answered. Perhaps this could be because Sartre has not provided us with enough details of his final ethics.

In a very informative essay, Churchill and Reynolds conclude the book with a discussion of Sartre's legacy. Sartre's legacy cannot be summarized and fixed once and for all. It is open to the future, and is constantly being described and re-described. They recount the Lévy-de Beauvoir affair (215-18) and present some criticisms of Sartre by Foucault, Derrida, Lyotard, and Deleuze (218-22). The section on "Returning to Sartre" is a must read for those interested in the significance of Sartre's philosophy of intersubjectivity for contemporary thought (222-28). They conclude by calling for a return to Sartre and by hoping that a "paradigm shift" (in the Kuhnian sense) will occur in which Sartre's existential phenomenology will have a special role to play in informing and transforming the contemporary developments on social cognition (228).

Overall, most of the authors do an impressive job in accurately elucidating Sartre's concepts and arguments without oversimplifying them. One can only hope that there will be more work like this.

[1] See Johanna Maria Tito, Logic in the Husserlian Context, Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1990, 57-165.

[2] Wilfrid Sellars, Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind, Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1997.

[3] Jean-Paul Sartre, "Freedom and Facticity: The Situation," Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology, translated by Hazel E. Barnes, New York: Washington Square Press, 1993, 489.

[4] Maurice Merleau-Ponty, "The Battle Over Existentialism," Sense and Non-Sense, translated by Hubert L. Dreyfus and Patricia Allen Dreyfus, Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1964, 77.