Jewish Philosophy in an Analytic Age,

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Samuel Lebens, Dani Rabinowitz, and Aaron Segal (eds.), Jewish Philosophy in an Analytic Age, Oxford University Press, 2019, 368pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198811374.

Reviewed by David-Hillel Ruben, University of London


Most departments of Jewish Studies offer a course in Jewish Philosophy. More often than not, such a course will provide the history of what many of the main Jewish philosophers thought, philosophers from Philo and the Medievals, through Spinoza and the Kantians, to the Modern period with such figures as Levinas, Rosenzweig, and Rabbi Joseph Soloveitchik. The course will not undertake any innovative Jewish philosophy, as this would be understood in analytic philosophy circles. It won't advance any argument about a philosophical topic beyond those claimed to be discovered in the texts. Its primary purpose will be to seek to understand how those earlier philosophers approached various philosophical topics.

But many contemporary philosophers, trained in analytic modes of philosophy, have begun to challenge that entirely historical approach to the subject, and this collection attempts to bring some of the main proponents of that challenge together in a single volume. Why now? My conjecture is that, until now, there just weren't so many analytic philosophers both with a good grounding in the classical Jewish texts and who found it intellectually challenging to try and marry the two traditions.

That marriage of Jewish philosophy and analytic philosophy is promising. Platonic, Aristotelian, Kantian, and Husserlian philosophy all had some specific content, and so historic attempts by Jewish philosophers working in these traditions necessitated either the demonstration of the compatibility of the philosophical tradition with Judaism or sometimes the alteration or adjustment of the philosophical tradition to conform with Jewish doctrine. But analytic philosophy, uniquely, is specific-doctrine free. The 'analytic' is in the method, not the content. (Early analytic philosophy may have been combined with doctrines such as logical atomism, reductionism, or logicism, but those days are long past.) Arguably, freed from the requirement of reconciliation of two sets of doctrines, analytic philosophy of Judaism is better placed than were its predecessors to allow for the emergence of an authentic Jewish philosophy (or better, philosophies).

In the collection, including an introduction and a skeptical overview at the end, there are eighteen essays, each raising a different philosophical topic. There are four main areas: Talmudic and Rabbinic Philosophy, Maimonidean Philosophy, Philosophical Theology, and Ethics and Value Theory. Many of the essays are exploratory, and have a certain pleasing air of diffidence and suggestiveness about them. Often, they seem to be trying out ideas, experimenting, with the result that often they do not read like standard analytic philosophical articles in the journals. Their undogmatic tone is commendable. Given the relatively large number of stand-alone contributions, the editors have done a good job in imposing strict limits of length on them, and in most cases, the articles fit about the right material into the space permitted. In one or two cases, however, this has led an author to try and cram in too much in a short space.

First, a word about the concluding skeptical challenge by Tzvi Novick, at the end of the volume. Every philosophical movement, school, or style needs a skeptical critic, so it is good that this has been included. But I can't say I have much sympathy with his point of view. Novick's main point is that some of the analytic Jewish philosophy represented in this volume is not sufficiently historical and, insofar as it is not, it might not count as a fully Jewish approach as that has been traditionally understood. Novick also says that such essays display a 'static' approach to Judaism.

But the Jewish intellectual tradition is a blend of both the historical and the non-historical. In a conventional house of Jewish study (a Bet Midrash), debate is conducted as if the compilers of the Talmud, the Medieval commentators, and their post-Enlightenment successors, are all simultaneously sitting around a single, heavenly table, debating the same question, a question that has the same meaning across twenty or so centuries. There is a kind of development in this method, but if it is historical, it is only historical per accidens. It is often closer to a logical sense of development, with refinements and distinction built on refinements and distinctions, much as it is in analytic philosophy. No one would care whether Descartes preceded Leibniz if there were an argument in Descartes that effectively countered one in Leibniz. So too, if we can find, for example, a distinction in the Medieval successors to Rashi (the Tosafos) that deals with a point raised by a nineteenth century commentator. Insofar as developmental is the antonym of static, there is both logical and historical development and no reason for Jewish analytic philosophy to prefer the latter rather than the former. What I shall do in this review is briefly describe the contents of the sixteen remaining contributions, and selectively remark on some. I won't have the space to deal even very briefly with all of them.

Unlike the others, Eli Hirsch is a longstanding contributor to the analytic philosophy of Judaism and is in many ways one of the inspiring figures for the movement. Many will already know of his 'Identity in the Talmud' in Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 1999. In this collection, Hirsch's 'Talmudic Destiny' returns to a set of concerns that Hirsch has previously addressed elsewhere, and attempts to tease out a view about the open future and time from some Talmudic and post-Talmudic material. Suppose there is a purported legal transaction at t (say, I want to contract to buy the house that my wife will only choose next week), so that this contract at t is dependent on the occurrence of some event at a later time, t*. An Aristotelian should hold there is no valid transaction. The question, says Hirsch, is whether 'the house that will be chosen by her next week' refers. According to Jewish Law, it must refer if the transaction is valid. There are, for the Aristotelian, no facts about future. Hirsch considers anti-Aristotelian responses, but he finds of particular interest the response, as he interprets it, by Rashi, the great late eleventh century Jewish legalist. On this view, unlike the Aristotelian absence of facts, there is a presence of indefinite facts.

Hirsch's essay provides a good foil for Aaron Segal's 'Metaphysics out of the Sources of the Halakha or a Halakhic Metaphysic?'. (Halakha means 'Jewish Law'.) Segal challenges the Hirsch-type project of finding metaphysical positions in the Jewish sources. Assuming a realist view of metaphysics, Segal points out the prima facie difficulty of reconciling this project with certain interpretative principles of Jewish Law. What he proposes as an alternative is that these Talmudic discussions are establishing a specifically 'halakhic' metaphysic and that it is wrong to read back into these discussions the same metaphysics that philosophers discuss. The point of view needs further clarification. Are the questions the same both in metaphysical and halakhic discussions? If they arrive at different answers, then, on a realist construal of metaphysics, one at most can be true. And if the questions they address are themselves different, then we need to be told how the questions themselves differ. Segal contrasts, for example, two different rabbinic responses to what appears to be a metaphysical question, that of Hillel and of Shammai:

Beit Hillel is making a metaphysical claim about what we might call Beit-Hillel-identity and Beit Shammai is making a metaphysical claim about what we might call Beit-Shammai-identityTheir dispute is about which of the various candidate relations in the vicinity of identity is the one that's relevant for halakhic purposes. (55)

But that still leaves unresolved the question of the relation between either candidate relation and the metaphysically correct one. What do we say if one or both of the candidates is metaphysically false?

In 'A Jurisprudential Puzzle as Old as the Talmud', Jeffrey S. Helmreich notes the conflict between two central principles of Talmudic and Rabbinic jurisprudence: (1) pluralism: the elu v'elu principle (two incompatible answers, both of which are licensed by the sources), and (2) faithfulness, which enjoins that the legal decider is required to determine the correct answer. Helmreich considers various purported solutions.

Samuel Lebens' 'A Commentary on Midrash: Metaphors about Metaphor' considers an extended metaphor in a source about the Song of Songs. An extended metaphor is a metaphor whose unpacking requires at least one other metaphor. Lebens argues that, whatever else extended metaphors are like, 'they have the (mysterious and still unexplained) power to transmits non-propositional knowledge.'

Dani Rabinowitz raise an epistemological question in the course of a discussion of repentance. Does repentance entail knowledge of forgiveness? If it does not, and so if the repenter never can be sure that he has been forgiven, whatever else repenting can achieve, it can't offer a catharsis to the repenter. In this context, Rabinowitz seeks to make sense of the rabbinic discussion of why one might require a person to repent repeatedly for the same fault.

The second section of the collection contains thee papers on Maimonidean Philosophy. To some extent, the section is an outlier in a volume which has the overall character that I have described. Mark Steiner's 'Hume and Maimonides on Imaginability and Possibility' compares the views of Hume and (Maimonides' version of) the Kalam Theology (which elides the possible with the imaginable) on the one hand with that of Maimonides on the other, which does not. To his credit, Steiner link his discussion to a contemporary discussion of a related question by Charles Parsons. Given the prominence of the topic of what linkage there may be between possibility, conceivability, and imaginability in contemporary philosophy (e.g., the possibility of zombies), the topic has a lot more relevance than the short space Steiner is able to provide for this. Daniel Frank's paper on 'Dispassion, God, and Nature: Maimonides and Spinoza' concerns the requirement of acting imatatio dei, and so, like God himself, acting dispassionately even when one is acting justly or virtuously. The Maimonidean view is compared to both the Stoic and Spinozan views. Here, some reference to contemporary action theory might have been helpful. On the so-called standard story, one needs both a desire and a belief to motivate action. Presumably, the human actor has the desire: the desire to act imatatio dei. God lacks that desire, since He lacks all desires. So perhaps the human actor can never be dispassionate in the way in which God is.

The third essay in the section, Josef Stern's 'Maimonides and his Predecessors in Dying for God as "Sanctification of the Name of God"' is an outlier in an outlier section. It is a fine essay, and certainly displays all of the analytic skills one would expect of a philosopher of the distinction of Stern, but the essay would more easily appear in a journal of Jewish Studies than in a collection of Jewish philosophy.

The section on Philosophical Theology commences with Howard Wettstein's 'The Fabric of Faith'. Wettstein's is perhaps the least analytic essay in the collection. His discussion is inspired by some remarks by Martin Buber, 'integrated with my own sense of religious life'. Wettstein offers an account of various attitudes, part of or closely associated with faith, and concludes with the intriguing idea of a centred-life, walking in God's tempo. Personally, I found this essay quite inspiring, although it might not appeal to everyone looking for a hard-edged analytic sell.

David Shatz's 'Should Theists Eschew Theodicies?' addresses a number of arguments that purport to show the undesirability or impossibility of attempts to justify the compatibility of evil in the world and God's goodness. A series of such arguments are described; Shatz finds all of them wanting, for one reason or another. To that extent, Shatz justifies the enterprise of theodicy.

Tyron Goldschmidt's 'A Proof of Exodus: Yehuda HaLevy and Jonathan Edwards Walk into a Bar' is both good fun (partly because of his engaging, humorous style) and philosophically interesting. It builds on an argument found in the Kuzari of Judah ha-Levi. The Jumbled Kuzari Principle says that a tradition is likely to be true if it is (1) accepted by a nation; it (2) describes a national experience of a previous generation of that nation; which (3) would be expected to create a continuous national memory until the tradition is in place; is (4) insulting to that nation; and (5) makes universal, difficult, and severe demands on that nation. Goldschmidt shows that some 'obvious' objections to this 'proof' don't hit their mark. One problem I had with the proof is its unclarity in what exactly is being proven. What is the content of 'tradition' in the argument? Is it a traditional belief, like the belief that the Exodus story is true? Or is it the onerous legal tradition, since it is practice and not belief that might be said to be 'difficult'? One's view about the strength the argument could provide will depend, inter alia, on the precise content in the conclusion.

Joshua Golding's 'Atzmut and Sefirot: A New Approach' discusses two ideas central to the Kabbalistic (mystical) tradition of Judaism: Atzmut (God as He is in Himself) and Sefirot (His manifestations). Golding is keen that these are not taken to be entities of some sort, since so doing raises difficult theological problems. Sefirot, he says, are 'basic ways in which atzmut . . . is manifest or expressed in the world' (251-252). But what is a way, metaphysically speaking? What is Atzmut? He says that the latter is Being as such. In one place, Golding compares the idea of Being in Itself with Plato's Forms, but without the existential commitment to Forms as Entities; it is what all beings have in common. What is the metaphysical status of something such that all things of a certain kind have it in common? Some clearer statement, alive to questions of whether existence is a property and related metaphysical issues, might have been helpful. The article really has, to my mind, no clear positive account of what this Being in Itself or its manifestations are meant to be.

The last section is on Ethics and Value Theory. Shira Weiss discusses 'The Morality of Biblical Deception: Misleading Truths, Geneivant Da'at, and Jacob's Deception of Isaac'. Is the duty not to lie absolute? There is a distinction between telling lie and telling a misleading truth. The closest parallel in Jewish Law is geneivat da'at (theft of one's wisdom or knowledge). A defense against x for having lied to y is that it is y's own fault that he did not correctly understand what x said or its implications, and so the alleged deception by x of y is akin to a form of self-deception of y by himself. With this in mind, Weiss re-reads the story of Jacob deceiving Isaac in order to obtain the blessing of the first born. There may be no geneivah, as a case can be made for Isaac having deceived himself in the circumstances. She makes a plausible case for her reading of the relevant text, based on the important distinction mentioned above, found in Kant and elsewhere.

Yonatan Y. Brafman poses a dilemma for rabbinic authority in his 'Neither Authoritarian nor Superfluous: A Normative Account of Rabbinic Authority'. If the commandments have an independent justification, rabbinic authority seems superfluous. If they have no independent justification, then rabbinic authority seems authoritarian, for it commands one to do something one has no reason to do. Brafman considers this dilemma in the light of the jurisprudential philosophy of R. Eliezer Berkowitz. On Berkowitz's conception, the purpose of ritual commandments is indirectly moral, because they stimulate the motivation for moral action. The interpersonal commandments of course directly achieve this end by commanding moral actions. In addition to the discussion of Berkowitz, Brafman's contribution ranges over positivism, and some of the ideas of H.L.A Hart, Ronald Dworkin, and Joseph Raz. He concludes with a description of inclusive legal positivism, on which the principles described by Dworkin are internal to the law itself. There follows a discussion of the extent to which this undermines Raz's service conception of law. Once principles are included in the law, don't the judges have to engage in practical reasoning too, and not just rely on texts? If they do, what real service does the law provide? Brafman's contribution is very full, perhaps overly full for a short contribution of this length. Nor was I entirely sure what the bottom line was meant to be for the topic of the essay.

'A Classical Jewish Approach to "The Normative Question"', by Melis Erdur, addresses the question: Why should I be moral? After considering the realist and anti-realist answers, Erdur suggests that Judaism might provide a new way of looking at the problem. Think of this question as being asked by an insider to morality or Judaism, as the case may be, not an outsider . . . it's confessional, not apologetic (my gloss-DHR). We say something that makes the agent reconnect, that reinforces his commitment in face of his doubt. We don't try offering a rational argument that will be equally valid for insiders and outsiders. I can't really see how this is meant to help with the classical philosophical question about morality. The person asking 'Why should I be moral?' is taking the outsider's point of view. Philosophers as different as Plato and Hobbes tried to show that one can appeal to the outsider's self-interest. Later contract theorists of morality have tried to do the same. Perhaps their attempts have not been wildly successful, but the question they were attempting to answer was the outsider's question, to which the response to the insider is simply irrelevant. Nor is it easy to identify what exactly the insider's question might be, at least in the case of morality. One can surely use a part of morality to make the insider more sensitive to some other part of morality to which the insider has previously been insensitive. That isn't news. But that isn't any part of the answer to the question, 'Why should I be moral?'.

Saul Smilansky's 'The Good, the Bad, and the Nonidentity Problem' asks: how can we regret that something happened in the past, or prefer that it had not happened? 'But the vast majority of people who now exist would not have existed were it not for those historical events' (309). Nor would have their ancestors, etc., all the way back to the past events in question. So, we are offered a package deal: either (1) those events that one regrets happen plus oneself or (2) the absence of the regretted historical calamity and the absence of oneself (and one's ancestors, etc.). It is not a logical inconsistency to want both (1) and (2). Smilansky says that it's a matter of causation. His 'solution' is the advocacy of Illusion. Just ignore the problem and continue regretting some events in the past but continue with our common beliefs about the self and others.

Perhaps Smilansky has developed this elsewhere in greater depth, but as presented here, his view immediately raises unanswered, indeed undiscussed, questions about causation and essences. Does his choice between (1) and (2) presuppose that something could not have had a different causal history than the one it did have? If c is a distant prior case of e, then (assuming some more bells and whistles about chains, for example) in the closest possible world, w1, to the actual world in which c does not occur, e also does not occur. (At least on one well-known account of causation.) So, it makes no sense to want not-c but e anyway in the world as it actually is, barring miracles anyway. But maybe what I regret isn't about a comparison between the actual world and w1 at all, but the regret is that that the actual world isn't a world w2 (a world that I would prefer to the actual world), a world that is less close than w1 is to the actual world: I would prefer a world in which not-c but e anyway. Smilansky also seems to assume that no event, say a war or a revolution, could happen at some different time, thereby making temporal location an essential property of an event.

The range of philosophical problems, raised in Jewish texts or in Jewish practice, which are addressed in this collection, is extensive. Most of the essays suggest new insights and different ways of addressing problems. Unsurprisingly, these relatively short essays all leave much more to be done. In all of the essays, so much more could be said, but alas, the nature of the collection simply does not allow for this. I think there is great promise here about the way in which philosophers in the analytic tradition will change Jewish philosophy, deepening it and adding something of enormous value.