Jewish Philosophy in the Middle Ages: Science, Rationalism, and Religion

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T. M. Rudavsky, Jewish Philosophy in the Middle Ages: Science, Rationalism, and Religion, Oxford University Press, 2018, 305pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199580903.

Reviewed by Samuel Lebens, University of Haifa


To write a book that's accessible to a wide audience, assuming no prior knowledge of Judaism or medieval thought, that contributes new insights to the academic community, and constitutes an intellectual history of Jewish thought from Isaac Israeli (832-932) all the way to Baruch Spinoza (1632-1677), including an important backward glance to Philo (b. 25 BCE), and to do so in a book of just ten chapters of manageable length, seems like an a priori impossibility. And yet T. M. Rudavsky achieves all of these things and more.

Rudavsky's ability to combine breadth, depth, and clarity, with concision and relative brevity is close to breath-taking. I have no doubt that this book will be of immense value to teachers of intellectual history, Jewish thought, and medieval philosophy.

Rudavsky doesn't merely want to lay out a history. She wants to introduce us to an intellectual landscape; to the questions, concepts, and challenges that faced Jewish thinkers throughout the middle ages. This poses a challenge. On the one hand, it demands that she organises the material in her book thematically rather than chronologically. On the other hand, one can't hope to understand the full significance of particular philosophical theories in the period without understanding the chronology, and without an understanding of the relevant Greek and Arabic schools of thought that shaped the intellectual climate in which these Jewish thinkers worked. Rudavsky finds an engaging way in which to square this circle.

Rudavsky crafts, in chapter two, a presentation -- in chronological order -- of all of the formative schools of thought that operate in the background of Jewish medieval thought. This chapter also contains concise and engaging biographies of the main protagonists of the book -- again, presented in chronological order. Those protagonists are: Saadya Gaon (882-942), Isaac Israeli, Solomon Ibn Gabriol (c.1021-c.1057), Abraham Ibn Ezra (1089-1164), Bachya Ibn Pequday (mid-eleventh century), Judah Halevi (d. 1141), Abraham Ibn Daud (1110-1180), Moses Maimonides (1138-1204), the Jewish encyclopaedists of the late thirteenth and the fourteenth centuries, Levi Gersonides (1288-1144), Hasdai Crescas (1340-1410), Joseph Albo (1380-1444), Isaac Abravanel (1437-1508), Judah Abravanel (1464-1532), Joseph Solomon Delmedigo (1591-1655), and Baruch Spinoza.

With this historical context in place, Rudavsky goes on to explore philosophical themes, rather than specific periods of history. How did Jewish thinkers in the Middle Ages try to reconcile their Judaism with the regnant science and philosophy of their day? Each chapter investigates a different dimension of this question. But, given the content of chapter two, and its whistle stop tour through the relevant history and biography, readers will be able to recognise the personalities, schools of thought, and historical circumstances, that rub shoulders in these pages.

Chapter three explores the various different philosophical methodologies adopted by her protagonists. Rudavsky extracts these methodologies from the introductions of multiple works of Medieval Jewish philosophy. This makes a good deal of sense. The introductions of those works tend to lay out their authors' methodologies. Accordingly, chapter three constitutes something of an introduction to Jewish philosophy through various introductions of works of Jewish philosophy!

Subsequent chapters explore, in conversation with our cast of philosophical protagonists, a whole host of the most central issues to animate medieval Jewish philosophy: proofs for Gods existence, debates about the nature of God, and our ability to describe Him (chapter four); the problem of evil, the threat of theological fatalism, omniscience, and God's relationship to time (chapter five); debates concerning the nature of creation -- whether it was ex nihilo (such that the universe was created out of nothing), ex materia (such that the universe was created out of some primordial formless matter), and whether it had a temporal beginning (chapter six); discussions of medieval cosmology, astronomy and astrology, and their relationship to classical Jewish beliefs (chapter seven); debates about the nature of the soul, its relationship to the body, and the prospects of posthumous life (chapter eight); and debates about the nature of virtue, civic and personal, and the role of political society (chapter nine).

What should be clear, from this brief summary, is the sheer scope and ambition of this book.

Having waxed lyrical, my first concern is that one of the stated aims of the book seems to have been largely forgotten. Rudavsky writes that the "Jewish philosopher is constrained to reconcile two distinct bodies of knowledge -- the secular and the religious" (p. vii). She goes on to promise that, "In this work, we will examine the extent to which this reconstruction . . . is successful" (p. vii). A book that makes such a promise surely has to subject the views in question to rigorous philosophical scrutiny. But the book is altogether lightweight when it comes to offering any contemporary critique and evaluation of its historical subjects.

To be fair, Rudavsky does sometimes step into the philosophical fray. For example, she argues that Ibn Daud and Gersonides were ultimately unable to accommodate a robust conception of prophecy in the face of their incompatibilism (p. 132). But, given the promise she had made to her readers, to examine the extent to which her subjects had been successful, it would have been nice to see her step into the fray more often.

For example, Ibn Daud and Gersonides felt compelled to adopt something like a growing block theory of time, in order to accommodate human freedom. They were of the opinion that the very existence of the future -- if there were such a thing for God to know -- would be incompatible with free will. For this reason, they adopt an ontology of time according to which the future doesn't exist. Only if there's no future, can we be free to write our own futures. A book that really wants to subject its protagonists to philosophical scrutiny should ask, at this point, whether an open future really is a pre-requisite for libertarian freedom. Peter van Inwagen, for example, argues -- forcefully -- that it is not (van Inwagen, 1983, ch. 2). If he's right, then the radical lengths to which Ibn Daud and Gersonides went to protect human freedom would have been wholly unmotivated. These issues go unexplored in Rudavsky's work.

Many of the philosophers that Rudavsky engages with were of the opinion that God transcends all of our categories of thought, and every genus and species. They contend that God's nature is simple. But Alvin Plantinga has argued that any such theology is hopelessly mired in contradiction and paradox (Plantinga, 1980). Plantinga's arguments were delivered with a sledgehammer and can be fairly accused of lacking nuance or historical awareness. But a book that promises to subject medieval views to philosophical evaluation shouldn't ignore such an influential critique, even if only to rebut it.

Perhaps historians will not be bothered by the lack of critical philosophical analysis, but -- as a philosopher -- it made the book harder to engage with. This criticism might be deemed unfair because it's merely a function of Rudavsky promising too much in a book that already delivers a great deal. Yes, the book is light on probing contemporary scrutiny of the views it presents, but it presents a great many views with admirable clarity and scholarship.

My second concern with the book focusses on one of its unstated aims. Clearly, the book seeks to present Spinoza as (1) a practitioner of Jewish philosophy. But more than that, it seeks to present him as (2) the culmination of the medieval Jewish thought that proceeded him. Rudavsky is successful in demonstrating (1), but her case for (2) is undermined by the disfiguring prism that she imposes upon the historical terrain.

Appealing to work that she co-authored with Steven Nadler, she defines Jewish philosophy as "philosophizing with and about the Jewish tradition, asking questions about Judaism as well as using Jewish texts and doctrines to engage in general philosophical speculation about classic problems" (p. 7). Even if the answers to these questions "differ radically from those provided by . . . more orthodox thinkers", the philosophy will be Jewish if it makes reference to the Jewish "religious and philosophical textual canon, and engage[s] in an extensive conversation across time with the same figures (e.g., Saadia ben Joseph, Ibn Gabriol, Maimonides)" (Nadler and Rudavsky, 2009, p. 3). This is as good a definition of Jewish philosophy as I'm aware of. It's clear to me that Spinoza qualifies. And if it isn't clear to you, it will be after you've read this book. But is Spinoza the natural culmination of the Jewish philosophy that came before him?

Rudavsky claims that he is. Spinoza's rejection of miracles, his naturalisation of the Bible -- which reduces scripture to a fallible source of moral guidance and piety ("not even moral truth"), devoid of any timelessly relevant content -- were, we are told repeatedly, the natural result of Spinoza's "pushing the views of Maimonides, Geronsides, and Ibn Ezra to their logical extreme" (p. 264; see also p. 207). Spinoza merely spells out "motifs already contained in embryo in his Jewish predecessors" (p. 263).

Rudavsky's argument is compelling, but it's ultimately deceptive. First of all, her presentation of Maimonides is -- as she freely grants (p. 154) -- controversial (as is every reading of Maimonides); and it accentuates his naturalistic tendencies. This already helps her to set Spinoza up as the natural consequence of what came before him -- because she could be accused of reading her Spinoza back into her Maimonides, in order to read Maimonides into her Spinoza. Moreover, and despite the fact that the cast of philosophers covered in her book is quite staggering, there is, nevertheless, a somewhat distorting prism in place.

The book, from its subtitle to the last page, seems to equate Jewish philosophy with those Jewish thinkers that have been labelled "rationalistic"; in opposition to those thinkers who comprise the mystical schools of thought. For this reason, Nachmanides -- surely one of the greatest Jewish philosophers of all time -- and the Zohar, barely receive a mention, and neither Joseph Gikatilla nor Abraham Abulafia appear at all. This is to be expected, even if it is to be lamented.

Academic studies of Jewish thought have tended, over many years, to make a hard and fast distinction between the philosophers and the mystics. But it's entirely unclear to me that this distinction is principled or well-defined.

The distinction owes a great deal to the work of Gershom Scholem (1897-1982), the first modern academic scholar of Jewish mysticism. Scholem didn't only study works that explicitly defined themselves as 'Kabbalistic'. Nevertheless, as David Blumenthal notes, Scholem was selective, in a somewhat idiosyncratic fashion, regarding the texts he included under the rubric of 'the mystical' (Blumenthal, 2009, p. VI):

[Scholem] studied carefully, among other subjects, the literature of the Heikhalot, of the Sefer Yetsira, and of the Zohar; the works of the Hasidei Ashkenaz, of Abraham Abulafia, and of Isaac Luria . . . [But] Scholem never devoted a full study to . . . Maimonides . . . Following Scholem, two generations of scholars of Jewish mysticism did not include Maimonides in their studies . . .

Bluemnthal contrasts this with the fact that "for 150 years, scholars of Jewish philosophy have seen Maimonides as the philosopher par excellence" (ibid.). So, whatever mysticism is, Maimonides is out. And, whatever Jewish philosophy is, the literature that Scholem studied is out. But this taxonomy is ad hoc and unprincipled. For one thing, it ignores Maimonides' own insinuations that he was the subject of mystical experience.

Menachem Kellner (2006) claims that ontological commitment to supernatural entities is a water-mark of Jewish mysticism. Jewish rationalism, by contrast, is defined in part by its commitment to the existence only of natural entities, and God. Perhaps Rudavsky would endorse the distinction drawn on those lines. But the distinction between the natural and the supernatural is far from simple to draw, and this threatens to collapse any distinction drawn in its wake.

Natural entities, you might think, are the ones that science posits; supernatural entities, by contrast, are the ones for which science has no use. But it certainly can't be that simple. The number and variety of entities that science posits changes as science develops. Absent a complete natural science, the naturalist is in no position to distinguish the natural from the supernatural, and so the distinction is of little use (cf., Crane, 1994, p. 480).

Consequently, I see no good reason to include only the so-called "rationalists" under the umbrella of medieval Jewish philosophy. And I see no reason to draw a hard and fast binary distinction between the "rationalists" and the "mystics". If you prejudice matters so as to concentrate only on those threads of Jewish thought that sought to downplay the "super-natural" -- so much so that Nachmanides doesn't count as a philosopher -- it's no wonder that you'll see Spinoza as the natural culmination of Jewish philosophy.

James Kugel is right to note that, "the minute one began to read Scripture", as Spinoza did, "with the same assumptions one brought to the reading of humanly authored books, the argument was lost" (2007, p. 35). Read with those assumptions in hand, the Holy scripture of Judaism is reduced "into a motley accumulation of historically dependent, culturally relative textual scraps" (Sommer, 2015, p. 18). But Kugel is eager to concede that if you're open to the existence of a personal God interacting with Jewish history, then there's no overwhelming reason to read Scripture with Spinoza's assumptions in hand.

It's true that many Jewish philosophers, prior to Spinoza, helped to depersonalize God. It's true that Spinoza demonstrates the logical extreme of (some aspects of) those currents of thought. But, as soon as you're willing to countenance an undercurrent of mysticism under the surface of some of the so-called Jewish "rationalists", and as long as you're willing to recognise that the tapestry of Jewish philosophy is wider even than Rudavsky's dazzling account presents, then Spinoza looks less like a culmination of a movement than a dead-end to be circumnavigated -- from a Jewish point of view.

On the assumption that Spinoza is the culmination of what came before him, perhaps Rudavsky wants to insinuate that the hope of reconciling traditional Jewish beliefs and science was, in fact, a failure. The confrontation between Judaism and science leads inexorably in the direction of Spinozism. If this is her point, then I can no longer accuse her of failing to live up to the promise of assessing the success of the overall project of medieval Jewish thought. Her conclusion was that it failed. Religion, in the end, simply had to give way to science. But if this is her conclusion, I fear that she has mistaken a wrong-turn for a summit.

In summary, the book doesn't deliver (at least not explicitly) on its promise to evaluate the success of the historical project that it describes. Moreover, in its assessment of Spinoza's place in that project, the book is under the sway of a deeply entrenched but misconceived prejudice of Jewish Studies. And yet, despite these flaws, Rudavsky has produced a magnificent and accessible work of scholarship that opens up an often-overlooked world of philosophy to scholars and laypeople alike.


This review was made possible through the support of a grant from Templeton World Charity Foundation, Inc. The opinions expressed in this review are those of the author, and do not necessarily reflect the views of Templeton World Charity Foundation, Inc. I would also like to take this opportunity to thank the late Gary Gutting for his many contributions to the philosophical community. May his memory be a blessing.


Blumenthal, D. R., 2009. Maimonides' Philosophic Mysticism. Daat: A Journal of Jewish Philosophy & Kabbalah, Volume 64-66, pp. V-XXV.

Crane, T., 1994. Physicalism (2): Against Physicalism. In: S. Guttenplan, ed. A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind. Oxford: Blacwell Publishers, pp. 479-84.

Kellner, M., 2006. Maimonides' Confrontation with Mysticism. Oxford: The Littman Library of Jewish Civilization.

Kugel, J. L., 2007. How to Read the Bible: A Guide to Scripture Then and Now. New York: Free Press.

Nadler, S. and Rudavsky, T. M., 2009. The Cambridge History of Jewish Philosophy: From Antiquity through the Seventeenth Century. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Plantinga, A., 1980. Does God Have a Nature?. Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.

Sommer, B. D., 2015. Revelation and Authority: Sinai in Jewish Scripture and Tradition. New Haven Ct: Yale University Press.

Van Inwagen, P., 1983. An Essay on Free Will. Oxford: Clarendon Press.