Johann Friedrich Herbart: The Grandfather of Analytic Philosophy

Herbart Analytic Grandpa

Frederick C. Beiser, Johann Friedrich Herbart: The Grandfather of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2022, 336pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192849854.

Reviewed by David Sullivan, Metropolitan State University of Denver


Frederick Beiser, now emeritus at Syracuse, is a renowned scholar who has made a number of seminal contributions to our understanding of post-Kantian philosophy. This volume adds to that growing list and contributes much to a deeper knowledge of philosophy in the nineteenth century. It should be warmly welcomed and much appreciated, constituting an absolutely necessary purchase for all academic libraries.

Its subject—Johann Friedrich Herbart (1776–1841)—has been, heretofore, utterly lost to academic philosophy. This, the first English language publication in decades, and the only one in English to give full prominence to his philosophy, is truly a major accomplishment. (Today Herbart is chiefly acknowledged as a psychologist and a pedagogue, to the degree that he is not forgotten entirely.)

Herbart “regarded himself as a Kantian” (3), but “from the year 1828” (4). As should become quickly apparent, this admission is not an espousal of orthodox Kantianism: just as Schopenhauer jettisons Kant’s view of the things-in-themselves, Herbart freely eliminates the transcendental aesthetic and the categories. And Herbart is somewhat more prominent, perhaps—in the history of psychology—for his attack on what he saw as Kant’s (and others’) “lazy” reliance on mental “faculties.”

Herbart, however, composed in the days of the “systems,” so there is a lot of ground to cover: his collected writings, in the last iteration (by Kehrbach and Fluegel), numbered nineteen substantial volumes. The various specifics of Herbart’s life and work are, in the book under review, covered in encyclopedic detail and it excels in distinguishing Herbart’s positions from those of many of his contemporaries. Because it takes the form of a philosophical biography, it is able to maintain a page-turning momentum while nonetheless surveying vast swathes of material and topics. Yet choices invariably involve compromises, some of which will be addressed in what follows.

Beiser typically organizes his philosophical biographies in a chronological fashion and that trend is followed here. As a result, some chapters have more historical or strictly biographical detail. Of the thirteen separate chapters, this reviewer will focus its attention only on a mere five, while giving the most weight to two: those that might give some indication of the potential interest for contemporary students of metaphysics and epistemology, while also highlighting the internal complexity of Herbart’s unique reflections.

The first of these is Chapter Five, where Herbart’s “Inaugural Dissertation” (80–83) is discussed. Herbart’s earliest devotion to classical philosophy begins his lifelong departure from what he called the “fashionable philosophy” (Modephilosophie) of the day, as represented by the famous idealists. Indeed, Herbart insisted on the superiority of “the basic concepts of Heraclitus, Parmenides, and Plato” (81) as compared with what he saw as the incoherence of the systems. Indeed, as Beiser notes: “In stressing the logical role of the ideas and in denying that they exist in any straightforward sense, Herbart anticipates Lotze” (82).

This critical introduction to Herbart’s thought is followed by Chapter Six, entitled “Three Major Works, 1806–1808” (and the second is Chapter Twelve). In this chapter, Beiser details, as the title indicates, three major but relatively early works by Herbart: Allgemeine Paedagogik (1806), Hauptpunckte der Metaphysik (1806), and Ueber Philosophisches Studium (1807). All of these books appeared when Herbart was still a mere Privatdozent at Göttingen, prior to obtaining Kant’s former chair at Köenigsberg, in 1809. There he would remain, until finally returning to Göttingen in 1833.

Herbart’s initial sketch of the main topics of “metaphysics” is actually his first foray into epistemology or, rather, a Kant-inspired examination of the very conditions of the possibility of experience. But this breezy description belies its inherent difficulty. As Beiser warns his readers: “The Hauptpuncte is a daunting and difficult work. Its exposition is dense in the extreme, often leaving the reader in a quandary about its precise meaning” (90). This is clearly an accurate estimation of the immense difficulties contemporary readers will face. The fact that Herbart returns to these topics, again and again, provides but cold comfort for we moderns, who will find ourselves uniquely unprepared for this particular task.

The introduction to Herbart’s work is framed by two central questions: “(I) How can ground and consequence be connected? (II) What is given?” Beiser suggests that this first question is “the same as the Kantian problem of the possibility of the synthetic a priori” and characterizes it as a dilemma:

Either: the ground contains the consequence in itself, so that the drawing of the consequence is indifferent to the ground, which remains the same before and after the inference. Or: the ground does not contain the consequence in itself, so that it needs the drawing of the consequence to be a ground of the inference [. . . .] The idea of the ground of the inference is therefore a contradiction because it both must and must not be connected with the consequence: it must be, because only that makes the inference valid; it must not be, because only that makes it non-trivial (92).

As will quickly become apparent, even to the most superficial student, many of Herbart’s aporias revolve around Eleatic quandaries of the one and the many, of identity and difference, and this first introduction provides no exception. (Because this is not Herbart’s final word, we will return to this topic shortly.)

The answer to the second question reveals the relation: “The given, we are told, is a pure many (ein reines Vieles) which are together or combined in some manner.” Once again, in the section which follows, the aforementioned Eleatic concerns quickly emerge:

We attribute being not to each sensation alone but to the complex of sensations, which we call a thing. “But what is a thing?” Herbart asks. This simple and basic question proves not so easy to answer. The concept of a thing conceals a contradiction. On the one hand, we think of the thing as a unity, as the whole of its properties; on the other hand, each of these properties is distinct from the other, referring to a unique and singular sensation. So, somehow, one and the same thing is both a unity and a plurality (95).

Having introduced his method—the “method of relations”—which essentially always dissolves the appearance of unity into posited pluralities, Herbart then goes on to address some of the basic concepts of metaphysics.

This basic, and quite early, exposition—one that will resist every attempt at further summary—culminates in Herbart’s first public reflections on Kant’s transcendental project: one where appearances give us some access to reality, not as it is in itself, but simply via a proper acknowledgement of “the givenness, irreducibility, and contingency of the sense qualities of experience, the fact that these qualities arise from an interaction of the representing subject and things outside it” (100).

Beiser does an excellent job of showing how Herbart’s odd views are actually a kind of alternative to the better-known Hegelian glosses and then neatly turns to the much more accessible “On Philosophical Studies.” This work concerns the very nature of philosophy, alongside its relation to the special sciences. The problem Herbart faced was as follows:

Now that he had rejected the speculative methods of Fichte and Schelling, the onus was upon him to determine what the method of philosophy should be. What should the method of philosophy be if there cannot be the infallible first principles, intellectual intuitions, and a priori constructions of the idealist tradition? (100–101).

Herbart subordinates the field of philosophy to those of the individual sciences while nonetheless providing it with a unique task: survey, correction, and unification. In so doing, Herbart focuses attention on individual concepts and the identification of philosophical problems:

Only the philosopher can perform this task, Herbart assures us, because his or her special business is the analysis of concepts. The other sciences use these concepts, to be sure, but they do not analyze them [. . . .] So philosophy is not only a systematic but also an analytical enterprise, ascending to a higher level where it not only uses but investigates concepts (102).

Such an approach culminates in the framing of specific problems, a practice which emerged in a wider fashion towards the end of the nineteenth century.

Next, we may note that: “In 1813, Herbart published one of his most influential and successful books, his Lehrbuch zur Einleitung in dies Philosophie” (171). Thus begins Chapter Nine. Many, many different topics are touched on here. However, of greatest salience to this volume’s subtitle is Herbart’s definition of philosophy as “working on concepts” (Bearbeitung der Begriffe) (173). As Beiser remarks: “The formula became famous and a slogan of the Herbartian school” (174). But what does this claim actually entail?

Beiser suggests that because philosophy takes as its objects the concepts employed by the special sciences (in their investigation of objects), that philosophy becomes “a second-order discipline” (174), one that “is a sui generis discipline all its own, having for its subject matter the concepts of all kinds of objects, though not any of the objects themselves” (175). Furthermore, philosophy alone also investigates a special set of additional concepts arising in “the fields of logic, aesthetics, and morals” (176).

In Chapter Eleven, we turn towards Herbart’s most historically influential work—the Psychologie als Wissenschaft (1824/25)—which continues in Kant’s Newtonian vein: if psychology is to be a science, if it is “to achieve the same exactitude and certainty as the natural sciences,” it would require “mathematical models and [. . .] precise qualitative laws” (216). Herbart argued for just such a possibility based on the fact that:

in the soul, there was also a wealth of quantitative phenomena. Representations are stronger and weaker, clearer and obscurer; their coming and going is faster and slower; their number greater or smaller; our receptivity to sensations, our excitability for feeling, more or less sensitive (219).

All of this brings us to one Herbart’s most important, but obscure, points: the move from empty abstraction, as a psychological technique, to full immersion in the concrete context of relations: “Herbart calls this method of restoring relations ‘completion’ (Ergaezung)” (223). This technique, familiar to mathematics, Herbart now identifies with his aforementioned “method of relations.”

The final chapter, discussed in what follows, recapitulates many of the same themes and motifs of Chapter Six, albeit with a different presentation: this is Chapter Twelve, “General Metaphysics.” Here we turn finally to the Allgemeine Metaphysik (1828/29), which is an imposing two volume opus. This too resists simple anatomization, but some of the aforementioned topics are fortunately revisited.

Beiser begins here with a most helpful review of some of the complexities of the Leibnizian-Wolffian tradition (245ff). Then, once again, we are returned to the topic of “the given,” which maintains its status as the necessary starting point:

In stressing the importance of the given, Herbart was intentionally departing from the metaphysics of the rationalist tradition. For Wolff and Baumgarten, metaphysics is the science of the possible, of whatever is even thinkable; and reality is only one form of the possible. For Herbart, however, metaphysics is the science of the real, of what is knowable [. . .] This is the only means by which metaphysics could achieve its goal: the knowledge of reality (256).

But “what is the given?” Herbart now declares that both the content and at least some aspects of form must be counted as “the given,” for there exist relations which are not the product of my own consciousness; as Beiser lucidly explains:

That I cannot touch the ceiling, that I see a rectangle when I look at this house, that this desk is about six paces from my chair—these are basic facts of my visual perception which I cannot alter by my will and imagination. They are relations which I do not directly see; but they are still basic facts which are independent of my conscious activity. If they depended on the perceiving mind, then it would be able to alter them through its activity; but it cannot do anything of the kind. Herbart holds that we can draw the same conclusion about all the relations of our experience (257).

Then, Herbart offers a new take on the problem of ground and consequent: “We must think of the ground as (1) a plurality, and as (2) a plurality whose members are reciprocally determining” (259). Hence, we may rightly conclude, with Beiser, that Herbart’s “method” is essentially “a method of resolving contradictions by distinguishing implicit or hidden elements in the subject term” (260).

This leads, quite naturally, to his reliance on a sort of heuristics he deems “accidental views,” which he sees as another extension of mathematical creativity into philosophy:

It means that we can provide many definitions of the subject matter but that we take none of them to be privileged, as if it alone described the essence of the object. The definitions are one of many possible “views” of the object, each of them depending on the perspective of the perceiver; but they are “accidental” or “contingent” because none of them are necessary, the sole possible perspective. They are also necessary, however, insofar as a certain definition in a certain context proves to be the only way to solve a problem (Ibid.).

This involves a process of “broadening” (erweitern) the ground: as we have already learned, the ground must be considered a plurality or system. (For example, although a particular sum is always a definite result, it can be arrived at in a number of strikingly different ways.)

Yet an accidental view is not merely a different way of arriving at a fixed end; rather, it involves a shift in perspective that allows us to simultaneously affirm and deny some property. But the perception of change rests solely with the observer, and is not found in the given. As Beiser explains: “This does not mean, however, that the intellect falsifies things [. . . .] Accidental views are then simply ‘expressions that things take on so that they are comparable’” (270).

Naturally, in all this, we have a sense that Herbart is mightily striving to find a realistic alternative to both the idealistic systems and Naturphilosophie. But many aspects of his system are so strange, and scarcely intuitive, often deriving sustenance from the pre-Kantian world of metaphysics. Even when we think we understand what Herbart is saying, we are often at a complete loss as to why he is saying that. We are left here sometimes with only a somewhat flat or doxographical dimension (in Richard Rorty’s sense).

Finally, we come to what some will see as a potentially polemical point: Beiser’s explicit claim that Herbart should be acknowledged as a progenitor of many of our contemporary concerns. “He represents a way of doing philosophy that is the ancestor of our own approach—philosophy as an analysis of concepts, philosophy as supported by mathematics, philosophy as an ally of science—and yet his paternity still has not been fully acknowledged” (1). Yet even stronger, perhaps, is this statement: “If Frege and Russell are the fathers of analytical philosophy, Herbart is its grandfather” (3). (Indeed, the very subtitle of the book is “the grandfather of analytic philosophy.”)

Now, while it may be wider knowledge that, for example, both Riemann and Frege took Herbart seriously, it is not at all easy to say precisely why. There are, of course, a number of possible lines of connection, already mentioned above, and yet, ultimately, the main salience would have to be located in the reworking of concepts and the method of relations. Still, in the mind of this reviewer, a number of pertinent questions linger. Herbart’s alleged paternity remains, for other researchers, to be further, and more fully, adjudicated.