John Dewey Between Pragmatism and Constructivism

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Larry A. Hickman, Stefan Neubert, and Kersten Reich (eds.), John Dewey Between Pragmatism and Constructivism, Fordham UP, 2009, xiii + 276pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823230181.

Reviewed by David Depew, University of Iowa



It so happens that there is a Dewey Center at the University of Cologne. How, when, and why it got there remains a bit of a mystery to me even after I read this book, but its inquiries have produced a school of epistemological thought that calls itself “interactionist constructivism”. The present volume presents the edited proceedings of a conference between two members of this school, Stefan Neubert and Kersten Reich, and some American Deweyans. These include two members of the Center for Dewey Studies at the University of Southern Illinois, Larry Hickman and Kenneth Stikkers, and a philosophically well-informed Professor of Education at Virginia Tech, Jim Garrison, who at the time of publication was also President of the John Dewey Society.

The book begins with a lapidary life of Dewey by Hickman and a review of literature by and about him by Neubert. Stikkers, who specializes in “connections between pragmatism and Continental thought”, then offers an account of the initial reception of pragmatism in German-speaking countries (270). It started with the Austrian Wilhelm Jerusalem’s uptake of Peirce’s appeal to community agreement in knowledge claims. Jerusalem thought he saw the relevance of Peirce’s idea to turn-of-the-twentieth-century German-language discussions of the sociology of knowledge. He went on to correspond with William James, translate his Pragmatism, and, in published articles, to identify correctly early pragmatism’s core belief that “metaphysical concepts express the world reality of a live creature who orients itself to its environment” (79). For Jerusalem and other German-speaking philosophers the American pragmatists were Lebensphilosophen. Relying almost entirely on Jerusalem’s interpretations and translations, Max Scheler approved of the American pragmatists’ stress on life as the locus of meaning, value, and knowledge, but seems to have viewed their empiricism as ruling out the intuitionism that his own Lebensphilosophie required. Things went downhill from there. Heidegger’s critique of Lebensphilosophie rejected naturalism of every sort and a fortiori the American sort. Soon James’s clever metaphor about the meaning of a term being its cash value was being taken at face value. Pre-World War II German philosophers, including Heidegger, took pragmatism to be a defense of capitalist ideology on a par with the Communists’ blather about dialectical materialism.

German interest in American pragmatism has had to contend with this image ever since. If this isn’t much of an issue in the present volume it is because the Cologne school has relied on Hans Joas’s more or less successful efforts to correct this misunderstanding, as Stikker reports (76). Nonetheless, the old rift between German philosophy and American naturalism is worth bearing in mind because it resurfaces in this volume as the central bone of contention between these latter day American and German Deweyans.

None of the Americans in this conversation is a neo-pragmatist of Rortyan stripe (232). To be sure, neo-pragmatists of Rorty’s (or Stanley Fish’s) sort readily qualify as constructivists. They think we invent rather than discover the concepts through which we interact with the world. But for the Cologne philosophers the Rortyan spin on “interactionism” is too thin to count as genuinely Deweyan, a point with which Hickman and Garrison agree. A fortiori, the Cologne school scornfully rejects the view that pragmatism blesses the idea that each person sees the world through his or her own subjective interpretive scheme. As put forward by Ernst von Glasersfield, the point of this argument is to make sure that teachers know that students do not come to the scene of inquiry as empty vessels. Learning is a matter of inquiring into more adequate “passing theories” than we begin with, a point so systematically overlooked by American science communication that it accounts in some measure for the growing scientific illiteracy of the American population. It is something else, however, to move from this problem to the incoherent claim that each person has his or her own paradigm, and something else again to argue that unless we agree with this kind of “subjective constructionism” we will be violating the norms of a culturally diverse democracy. The Cologne school’s insistence on communicative interaction as a condition of the possibility of interpretation and knowledge rules out subjectivism of this sort (51, 54). Still, I must sadly report that supersized portions of something pretty close to this defective view are currently being doled out to students in American colleges of education under the name of “constructivism”.

Although the representatives of the Cologne school wisely position themselves to the right of neo-Pragmatists, they position themselves to the left of Garrison and especially Hickman. This is because Hickman sticks up for Deweyan naturalism by arguing, as Dewey himself might well have done, that the natural sciences result in culturally invariant, albeit changeable and differently applicable, universal claims (143, 152). Hickman even implicates the social sciences in this position. He thinks that Dewey’s appeal to warranted assertibility within communities of inquiry sufficiently differentiates his claims about universalism from scientistic objectivism to allow his ideas to qualify as socially constructivist. (Note: social constructivism is not the same idea as social constructionism as the latter phrase is used in science studies. Social constructionism could not possibly, even if problematically, be consistent with culturally invariant universality. Its main claim is that particular social relations are the real referents of scientific claims about nature.)

For his part, Garrison gives an accurate and insightful account of Dewey’s philosophy by taking as its foundation, first fruits, and lasting leitmotif Dewey’s reconstruction of the reflex arc account of action. An action is not the output of an efficiently caused sequence of events that begins when living beings are hit by an external stimulus in the way freight trains hit each other when they are being coupled up in train yards, to use Dewey’s own comparison. The ontological status of humans as organisms orienting themselves to an environment entails that even stimuli, not to speak of actional responses, are identified only in the course of a process in which the organism works up and works through various means of changing environments to resolve problematic, often painful, impediments to the flow of experience. “The operations involved in the motor response,” writes Garrison, " ‘constitute’ or construct the stimulus that redirects and guides activity. What the stimulus is and what the response is emerge in the transaction" (87). Using the word “construct” to name the inventional character of ideas seen as instruments or tools for changing problematic environments and insisting that all such instruments are necessarily embedded in linguistically mediated social contexts is about as far as Garrison goes toward Cologne’s “interactionist constructivism”.

Kersten Reich responds on behalf of the Cologne school. He insists that in the condition of post-modernity the proliferation of discourses and “the dislocation of observer-positions have so profoundly — and irretrievably — pluralized” interpretive communities that one cannot speak of universality at all (119). If Dewey didn’t see this it was because his own cultural limitations led him to underestimate the role of power in knowledge production and to assume that successful inquiry is relatively easy. The implication is that contemporary Deweyans should not make his provincial mistake.

Stephan Neubert’s way of articulating the Cologne position shows just how serious their relativity claim is. Neubert puts a Lacanian spin on what socially constructed knowledge is up against. Frustrated desire generates — socially constructs — a symbolic order that exercises power over the imaginary and so deeply deflects reference to the Real that stable objects of knowledge are well nigh impossible. On this desire-based view of the mind the intellectualist Dewey looks very weak. “Dewey,” writes Neubert, “tends to overestimate the symbolic dimension as compared to the imaginative mirror experiences … and so underestimates the intricate power effects always at stake … as Foucault so convincingly argues” (176). That’s an understatement. I personally don’t see how any recognizable form of Deweyan pragmatism stands a chance if this way of framing the problem is accepted. In any case, neither of the Americans in the dialogue seems even minimally equipped to respond to this way of putting things.

Jürgen Habermas’s Peircean theory of inquiry, as well as his neo-Kantian claim that the methods of the natural sciences differ from the hermeneutical methods of the human sciences, seem to be ghostly presences in this conversation. That is not odd. Cologne isn’t far from Frankfurt and Habermas has enjoyed great influence in America. Yet the German and American Deweyans whose work is displayed in this volume reject both Habermasian claims. Hickman thinks that Dewey’s distinctive pragmatic account of experimental method covers both natural and social scientific problems equally well. Reich and Neubert think that Habermas’s stress on communicative interaction sorts ill with his Peircean view about truth and the methodological autonomy of the human sciences. Communicative interaction should be reframed on Dewey’s terms.

The book ends with a reconstructed e-mail dialogue among the five contributors that clarifies and sharpens their differences and hints at the point of their conversation. That point, it seems, is to imbue Germany with an epistemology and pedagogy befitting its democracy and to call America back to Dewey’s democratic vision (233). In this connection, Reich and Neubert think that Hickman’s relatively conservative views about natural science are too much driven by an effort to silence creationists, who have flourished under the relativist, including neo-Pragmatist, inclinations of our time (212-13). This seems a potentially distorting motive for formulating a scientific epistemology.

In this edited conversation we hear time and time again how differences among the participants are merely differences of emphasis. The conversation may be too polite. On my reading there are far more flat out contradictions between the two sides than the book lets on. I do invite readers, however, to work through the issues posed for themselves. They won’t be wasting their time.