John Dewey's Quest for Unity: The Journey of a Promethean Mystic

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Richard Gale, John Dewey's Quest for Unity: The Journey of a Promethean Mystic, Prometheus Books, 2010, 215pp. $32.98 (hbk), ISBN 9781591026303.

Reviewed by J. E. Tiles, University of Hawai'i at Mânoa



Richard Gale professes to favor “determining the greatness of a philosopher … by the morally beneficial effects that the philosopher’s writings have on the reader. By this criterion,” he reckons, “John Dewey must be the greatest philosopher of all time” (9). However, Gale urges, Dewey’s “grand normative vision” — a “pyramid” the apex of which is growth, and the supporting strata of which are inquiry, democracy, freedom, communication and education — needs to be freed from “his misbegotten attempt to root it in his metaphysics” (16). This metaphysics in its turn needs to be rescued from the implications of Dewey’s “”SpellE">metaphilosophical theory about the nature of philosophy," which requires that a metaphysical theory be verifiable and contribute to meliorating the problems of men. This requirement “would rule out Dewey’s metaphysics, along with most of his philosophy, as illegitimate” (ibid.).

The thesis, thus outlined, could consistently be advanced by a sympathetic, if severe, critic — even by one who casts his “often quite harsh” criticisms in quite harsh terms (ibid.). It is possible, after all, to recognize that one’s “hero” (12) on occasion “waffles” (123) and is sometimes guilty of “fanaticism” (18, 66, 71, 89), “bogus argument” (37), “gaseous talk” (43, 96), “mad dog pronouncement” (91) and even “moral idiocy” (69). However, some of Gale’s irreverent images and comparisons are unflattering enough to stray into satire. In a “more enlightened society than ours, John Dewey would be a suitable subject for a Mattel action figure — with cord at the back which, when pulled, results in some of his choice pronouncements, like ‘growth is inquiry’, ‘inquiry is democracy’, ‘democracy is education’, ‘education is growth’” (9) — and whose “big bold original idea … earns him an ”SpellE">honored place in the Philosophical Hall of Fame in Steubenville, Ohio" (111).

Elsewhere Dewey is compared to a “Madison Avenue huckster” (84), “a veritable Jack Horner who pulls out of experience whatever plum is required” (168), a “reformed metaphysician struggling to resist temptation”, who “If he allows himself just one sip of metaphysics … will end … spouting incoherent drivel about the Absolute” (115-6). Dewey’s deciphering of the significance of the metaphysical theories of others was, in another burlesque image, accomplished with the aid of a “Captain Midnight secret decoding ring that he received in the mail for sending in four box tops from ”SpellE">Ovaltine" (198).

One might well pose as sporting1 a “‘Kiss me: I’m a ”SpellE">Deweyite’ button in the parade up Fifth Avenue on John Dewey Day" (16) while seriously claiming Dewey as one’s “inspiration” and one’s “ideal of what a human being should be” (10). But how seriously one can speak of the morally beneficial effects of a philosopher’s writing while in the next breath confiding that “Ever since I first read John Dewey, which was in my first philosophy class in 1950, I have firmly believed that if I would place one hand on my copy of his ”“>Experience and Nature, opened or unopened, it didn’t matter, and the other where it hurt, I would be cured” (ibid.)? Readers will have to sort out for themselves when Gale is speaking with tongue in cheek.

What tension there is between expressions of respect and ridicule is eased somewhat by the fact that Gale’s admiration is directed more toward the philosophic position that results from the critical pruning and grafting that he recommends. Indeed the second half of Gale’s book is directed toward liberating the metaphysicolholic, whom he sees lurking in Dewey’s corpus and for whom he evidently feels considerable sympathy. Gale himself regards metaphysics as “an intrinsically rewarding activity” (134). He maintains that the attempt to proscribe it is, because “there is no agreed decision-procedure for resolving disputes between metaphysicians, … an act of cultural barbarism analogous to someone who burns down the Louvre because no decision-procedure can be produced to determine when a painting is good (133).

”NDPRBodyTexT">Accordingly Gale argues that his subject is committed to a metaphysic of pure experience that is barely distinguishable from the absolute idealism of Dewey’s early period (163). There is, Gale observes, “a limited and an all-inclusive sense of ‘experience’” (ibid.; cp. 123). The former is the “ordinary common sense experience that results from the interaction of a human organism with its environment” (ibid.), and the latter is a Plotinian-Hegelian (162) “Absolute, the only true individual, with everything emanating out of it” (163).

This, Gale acknowledges, “goes well beyond the letter of Dewey’s text” (ibid.). Indeed Dewey repudiated the idea that the inclusive notion of experience required an entitative interpretation (its own “subject matter”) as well as William James’s notion of pure experience (167), which informs the doctrine Gale wants Dewey to embrace. (Gale refers to this as a Milesian understanding of pure experience because of the tradition that Thales distinguished two types of water, that which we drink and the metaphysical water that serves as the underlying stuff of all changes (166).) Dewey’s resistance to these doctrines “is not decisive, for in general, an author does not have a privileged authority with regard to the proper interpretation of his text” (167).2

Gale, moreover, regards as absurd (167) Dewey’s effort to avoid an “”SpellE">entitative interpretation" by claiming “‘experience for philosophy is method, not distinctive subject matter’ (LW 1: 371)” (164). A charitable interpretation of this claim would be to take it as the principle that whatever we represent to ourselves is conditioned by our experience. That means that we cannot offer a privileged description of the “world-as-it-is-in-itself apart from its relation to men” (124). The alternatives to this are not limited solely to “a description of man-in-the-world” (philosophical anthropology, ibid.) Many of our inquiries focus on aspects of the natural world that do not include human beings. The methodological principle that Dewey sees as embodied in his inclusive notion of experience merely cautions us not to forget that the descriptions we come up with, even in these cases, are conditioned by our physiology, technology and the forms of representation that our culture makes available to our imaginations. It is this rather than any verificationist principle that lies behind Dewey’s metaphilosophical hostility to traditional metaphysics.

Gale recognizes that embedded in Dewey’s late-career venture into metaphysics is a form of “transcendental deduction argument” (131, cp. 159). To be sure, some of Dewey’s suggestions about the categories appropriate to the description of experience — e.g., his “event ontology” - are even less convincing than Kant’s attempt to justify his categories in terms of the forms of judgment that are needed to make self-conscious experience possible. From the premises that (1) human experience is a natural phenomenon (naturalism), (2) what is in experience is a feature of reality (naive realism), and (3) experience is structured by inquiry (which is a response humans make to what they experience as precarious, uncertain and incomplete), it is not at all implausible to argue to the conclusion that what elicits inquiry are features of the natural world every bit as real as the stable, fixed and complete.

This argument would in Kant’s terms (first Critique A296/B353) be transcendental, leading us by reflection on experience to the features that must structure it, not to features that are transcendent, features of some generalized object of experience: reality-as-it-is in-itself apart from its relation to human experience. Given that the influence of Kant on Dewey is every bit as pronounced as that of Hegel (to which Gale repeatedly alludes), it would be fairer to read Dewey as sharing Kant’s hostility to “dogmatic metaphysics” and engaged in a species of what Kant would call “critical metaphysics.” In that case it is totally inappropriate to father on Dewey any account of reality-as-it-is-in-itself, let alone one that amounts to monistic Absolutism.

Dewey’s commitment to monistic Absolutism follows, according to Gale, from a principle that he dubs the “Humpty-Dumpty Intuition”: “It is impossible for numerically distinct individuals to stand in any direct non-mediated relation, such that, for example, one temporally succeeds, perceives, knows, or causes the other” (23), where by ‘numerically distinct individuals’ Gale means “entities that exist separately and independently of each other” (159). Dewey may have been committed to a principle of this sort in his early period, but the textual evidence Gale offers from Experience and Nature to show that Dewey continued to adhere to the principle (162-3) will appear convincing only to readers who, like Gale, are unable to recognize the passages cited as expressions of Dewey’s own brand of critical methodology.

Following this method leads us to see that our representations of reality — of natural phenomena that include human experience — are products of inquiry, the activity that structures (continually reconstructs) experience. Improvements in those products may well introduce distinctions between things that can exist independently of one another as well as lead us to recognize that things we previously thought were capable of independent existence are in fact internally related. When the products of different inquiries conflict, or simply fail to relate intelligibly to one another, we are confronted by further stimuli to inquire in an effort to reconcile our representations. There is no need, and it would be wholly inappropriate to assume here, that experience in all its diversity is really a manifestation of some unitary absolute.

Gale treats Dewey’s account of inquiry with deference (29) except for the thesis that “an adequate resolution of a problem is … based on the transformation of some ineffable property of a situation into another ineffable property having just the sort of unification that was lacking in the former” (41-2).3 Gale nevertheless believes that Dewey’s enthusiasm for inquiry amounts to the fanaticism that holds, “there cannot be enough of a good thing” (18). He attributes to Dewey, and offers reasons for rejecting, both the doctrine that we always inquire (67-8) and that we ought always to inquire (69, 81-4).

Why one might need to urge us to do what we always do anyway can be made plausible by interpreting ‘inquiry’ more narrowly in the normative claim. What Dewey is urging us to do is to take active control of the responses we naturally make to problematic situations and apply deliberately our cultural resources of symbolic representation to aid in transforming an indeterminate4 problematic situation into one that is “determinate in its constituent distinctions and relations” (LW 12: 108). What even a non-symbol using organism will do in the face of a problematic situation is reconstruct its habits of response (cf. Dewey’s account of the infant and candle in his treatment of the reflex-arc concept EW 5: 97 ff.), and it appears that humans are prone to respond at this level and not to bring all available cognitive resources to bear — i.e., to inquire in the favored sense — when involved in problematic situations. Gale reports that Thomas Alexander and Tom Burke held that even non-conscious individuals engage in forms of response (“proto-inquiry”) when faced with forms of problematic (“”SpellE">tensive“) situations that are continuous with inquiry in the ”SpellE">favored sense. Late in his book (179) Gale acknowledges that this interpretation rests on an application of Dewey’s principle of continuity, but Gale earlier declined (70) to adopt the generous reading of ‘inquiry’ when criticizing Dewey’s “false assumption that we are always inquiring” (71).

Gale’s argument to the effect that it is a bad idea to apply conscious inquiry in all problematic situations - in particular to interpersonal relations - rests entirely on one anecdote relating Sidney Hook’s apparent failure to inquire and another purporting to illustrate the folly of thinking carefully, rather than following gut feelings, when it comes to affairs of the heart (81-2). Gale throughout treats emotion and cognition as independent and often opposed, when it is clear even in Dewey’s early writings (e.g. EW 4: 152-188) that emotion and cognition are intimately related. This approach lends itself to a positivist framework of interpretation — what is devoid of cognitive content has only emotive significance - and Dewey, who rejected the positivists’ emotive theory of ethics, is said to have embraced their emotive theory of metaphysics because he believed that metaphysical claims are unverifiable (116-7).

Another positivist dualism, which informs Gale’s reading of Dewey, is a sharp distinction between, on the one hand, conceptual connections and, on the other, connections variously described as “causal” (11, 171), “empirical” or “contingent” (32, 171). Dewey can’t, Gale insists (171) treat the relationship between organism and environment as both “necessary conceptual” and “causal contingent.” But it is surely not unreasonable to expect that under inquiry the status of connections will shift classification and the classifications themselves will blur. We may not have found that the atmosphere of our planet is dependent on creatures with lungs in the way that creatures with lungs are dependent on the atmosphere (174), but it has recently emerged that the composition of the atmosphere has been profoundly affected by the presence of plants - see Oliver Morton, Eating the Sun, London Fourth Estate, 2009, pp. 242-54.

The status of the (under Gale’s interpretation) crucial Humpty-Dumpty principle is likewise handled in positivist fashion. To claim the principle can be verified by “our gross experience, being a manifest feature of all our perceptual experience” would be “another instance of Dewey’s fake empiricism” (192; cf. 168):

When I see a chair next to a table, for example, I don’t see them emanating out of some background unity, nor do they appear to be interdependent parts of some organic unity. Each has its own distinct individuality that is completely independent of the other (192-3).

Indeed Dewey, whose experience rests on a similar sediment of successful inquiries, would doubtless see these two pieces of furniture in the same way.

But having convinced himself that the Humpty-Dumpty intuition is indispensable to Dewey’s account of the-world-as-it-is-in-itself, Gale sees only one way properly to secure this principle. By virtue of acknowledging that significant aspects of experience, ‘immediate experience’ — in particular the experience “of unification through active control of a physical medium” (43) that brings satisfactory closure to inquiry - cannot be represented conceptually, cannot be given articulate expression, and are therefore ineffable, Dewey, is thereby committed to a form of ‘mysticism’.

Dewey, however, staunchly insisted that mystical experiences “lack any cognitive or ”SpellE">noetic value" (201); like other ineffable aspects of experience they may be “had” but they cannot without reconstruction through inquiry be “known”. Gale quotes Dewey (from LW 9: 26): “”GramE">’As with every empirical phenomenon, the occurrence of the state called mystical is simply an occasion for inquiry into its mode of causation’" (202-3). Nevertheless, if no evidence of the Humpty-Dumpty intuition is available through the influences of the world on our five senses, Dewey is forced, Gale insists, to recognize a cognitive species of mystical experience that will provide evidence (199) for the principle that underwrites the metaphysics he longed for, even if he did not espouse it.

The Prometheanism of Gale’s subtitle represents Dewey’s commitment to an image of human beings as active, especially when engaging the world with their cognitive faculties. Given that Gale’s interpretation is framed throughout by assumptions that were prevalent in the mid-twentieth century and resulted in the eclipse of Dewey’s influence, it is not altogether surprising that his efforts to marry Dewey’s Prometheanism to a mysticism, which “requires that the subject overcome her Promethean proclivities, [and] become passive” (19) results in a reductio ad absurdum rather than a coherent interpretation of Dewey’s philosophy.

1 The full sentence begins “I still sport of my ’Kiss me: . . .” The intrusive ‘of’ is one of three misprints I noticed. “Greta Gabor” should read “Greta Garbo” (104), and “it is logically possible there exist an ”SpellE">unthought of object" should read “exists” (166). The following seem to be failures of copy editing rather than misprints: “Often my criticisms … will have a rigor, precision, and clarity … thereby belying [betraying?] ”GramE">my background as a so-called analytic philosopher" (17); the second occurrence of ‘Tiles’ on p. 181 should read ‘Boisvert’ and the index entry for ‘Tiles’ (214) modified accordingly.

2 In his second chapter, which is devoted to Dewey’s theory of art and esthetics, Gale insists on the need for criteria, to determine when esthetic experiences that are occasioned by a work of art are linked to it in appropriate ways. He suggests “It is because we think the ideas, intentions, meanings, and feelings, yea the very mind and spirit, of the original creator imbue or become incarnate in the created product or work” (57) that creators of works of art have an authority over the appropriateness of responses to their works that philosophers apparently lack. Given the similarity between the value of metaphysical theories and works of art - the “cultural barbarism” of rendering traditional metaphysics illegitimate being tantamount to burning down the Louvre, since like art “the only justification for metaphysics is metaphysics, it being an intrinsically rewarding activity” (134) — one might find puzzling the greater authority over the understanding of their work that is accorded to artists.

3 Related to this is Gale’s claim that Dewey made a big mistake in treating the situations that initiate inquiry as ineffable, as this renders collective inquiry impossible (30, 34-5). To begin collective inquiry, however, people simply need to share the feeling of confronting a problematic situation; the first step in the inquiry will be to agree on a description of what the problem is — characterizing a problem is, after all, often the most important step toward resolving it.

4 As part of showing that Dewey is committed to monistic Absolutism Gale offers an argument that Russell “lazily failed” (188) to supply arguments in support of the claim that every problematic situation is identical to every other. The argument neglects to take seriously Dewey’s characterization of problematic situations as ‘indeterminate’ and freely applies the law of excluded middle to identity statements about such situations, “Either U1 = U2 or it is not the case that U1 = U2” (ibid.).