John Duns Scotus on Parts, Wholes, and Hylomorphism

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Thomas M. Ward, John Duns Scotus on Parts, Wholes, and Hylomorphism, Brill, 2014, 200pp., $128.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004278318.

Reviewed by Robert Pasnau, University of Colorado Boulder


This new monograph, based on the author's PhD dissertation at UCLA, offers a close analytic study of Scotus's metaphysics of substance. Thomas Ward makes some original and important contributions to his subject, which I will come to below, but it should be said at the start that only a dedicated aficionado of medieval metaphysics is likely to persevere through his intricate discussions. Ward takes for granted a readership that is both well-versed in the nuances of medieval Aristotelianism and already motivated to work through its considerable complexities.

It is perhaps characteristic of PhD dissertations in general that they offer a fairly narrow window onto the material they encompass, but the fault is particularly noticeable in the context of Scotus's extravagant metaphysical realism. Metaphysical extravagance is rather like political conservativism in being an opinion that may be forgiven in those who have long reflected on the alternatives, but that in neophytes looks simply like a character flaw. The problem in the present case is that we are all, more or less, neophytes when it comes to medieval metaphysics. So when Ward, from page one, throws us into the very deepest part of the scholastic pool and expects us to swim along as he works through the subtleties of Scotistic hylomorphism, it takes considerable perseverance to stay in the water. For all but the most dedicated acolytes of the Subtle Doctor, the question must constantly recur, Is all this really worth it?

The territory Ward takes us through is, first, Scotus's conception of prime matter, then his conception of how substantial form and prime matter compose a unified substance, and finally the status of the parts of a hylomorphic substance. There was a time, not so many years ago, when one could simply plunge into a topic like this -- effectively, any area of scholastic philosophy beyond Aquinas -- without worrying much about rival scholarship. There weren't any rivals, and so simply working through the texts could count as a major achievement. Today, however, even while vast areas of scholastic thought remain completely unexplored, our understanding of the work of major figures on the most central topics has begun to get filled in. This is certainly the case with regard to Scotus's metaphysics, and in some places it is not clear that Ward's discussions, for all their intricacy, make any new contribution. That concern is aggravated by the rather slight attention that Ward pays to what is, by now, a fairly large secondary literature on these topics. A few names get repeated notice, but other prominent scholars are omitted entirely, and European scholarship is largely ignored. (The bibliography lists only three studies not written in English, all from the 1950s.)

But enough complaints. This is a valuable book, rich in philosophical insight and careful in textual exegesis. The highlight of the book, and its central focus, is Scotus's distinctive conception of substantial form. It is by now well known that Scotus takes issue with Aquinas's "unitarian" conception of substantial form, and offers in its place "pluralism." This is to say that whereas Aquinas thought that each material substance has just a single substantial form, Scotus argues that at least some material substances have multiple substantial forms. This is a familiar story, and not particularly distinctive of Scotus, inasmuch as the debate between unitarians and pluralists began a generation before Scotus and ran all through the scholastic era. Ward's interest, however, is in a feature of Scotus's view that has commanded much less attention: the way he postulates not just a substantial form for the whole substance, but also distinct substantial forms for various parts of the substance -- what we might call partial forms.

From the usual vantage point -- the debate as it ran between Aquinas and his opponents -- this aspect of Scotus's theory is liable to seem bizarre. We are used to disagreement over whether a human being has just a single substantial form, the rational soul, or multiple substantial forms, one supplying rationality, another corporeality, and perhaps a third for our sensory nature. But that there might also be partial forms -- that the whole substance might be made up of partial substances each with its own distinct substantial form -- is liable to seem entirely alien to scholastic Aristotelianism as we know it. The great merit of Ward's book, then, is to call attention to this neglected topic.

The best-known aspect of Scotus's views in this domain is his defense, in the case of living things, of a forma corporeitatis -- i.e., a substantial form of the body that is distinct from the higher substantial form, the soul, that gives the body life. Remarkably, in Chapter 5, Ward argues at length that scholars have badly misunderstood Scotus's view here. For once one notices that Scotus argues that there are distinct substantial forms for various parts of the body, the question arises of how those partial forms relate to the form of corporeity. The few scholars who have attended to Scotus's remarks about these partial forms have taken the form of corporeity as something over and above the partial forms.[1] But Ward argues, compellingly if perhaps not quite decisively, that the textual evidence favors a different view: that what Scotus calls the form of corporeity is in fact not a single form at all, but simply the conjunction of these various partial forms. Strictly speaking, then, on Ward's reading, there is no form of corporeity in Scotus. (The key text here, for readers who are skeptical, is Questions on the Metaphysics VII.20. Ward compares this discussion with the better-known treatment in Ordinatio IV.11, which he concludes (p. 93) is at least consistent with QMet even if it does not take a definite position on the issue.)

Hard on the heels of this reductive understanding of the form of corporeity come a host of further questions, many of which Ward struggles admirably to answer. First and foremost, there is the question of what gives a living body the right sort of unity to be informed by a soul. It is axiomatic on the hylomorphic approach that a soul cannot inform just any sort of body -- human souls need human bodies, giraffe souls need giraffe bodies, and so on. Part of the point of the pluralistic approach, with its form of corporeity, is to provide an account of what makes a body suitable to take on a certain sort of soul. But if a body is just an agglomeration of various organs and limbs, each having its own distinct substantial form, then one might well doubt whether it is sufficiently structured to be informed by a soul at all. Chapter 6 shows how Scotus expressly recognizes this concern and solves it by invoking a different sort of metaphysical apparatus that he develops at great length in other more well-known contexts: the notion of an essential ordering between discrete entities. Later chapters then apply this same approach to the question of why Scotus does not think that the four elements retain their substantial forms within a mixed body, and why the notion of partial forms should not be pressed all the way to the point of thinking of the whole universe as a single substance (a question that in fact Scotus explicitly addresses!).

These remarks barely begin to plumb the depths of the waters Ward is exploring. But even if such debates seem obscure to us, they were by no means so within the scholastic tradition. For centuries after Scotus's death in 1308, the question of whether the parts of a material substance have their own substantial forms was debated at considerable length, and always treated as a characteristic thesis of Scotism. The issue is of more than merely technical interest, because it is symptomatic of a larger tendency in philosophy between 1300 and 1700, toward thinking of Aristotelian hylomorphism not just as a metaphysical thesis, but as an explanatory tool in natural philosophy (a strategy that of course finds considerable encouragement in Aristotle himself). On Aquinas's unitarian account, one and the same substantial form actualizes each and every part of the body, making the heart be one way and the lungs another. This allows for a robust account of substantial unity, but gives little by way of a biological explanation of a living thing's organic complexity. If we want form to explain that, then the natural move is to suppose that the different bodily organs each have their own substantial form. Once we take that step, it becomes possible to talk about substantial form in ways that look like more than just mere magic. What, for instance, accounts for the distinctive characteristics of bone? On the prevailing science of the day, it was thought to be a certain mixture of the four elemental qualities. Hence the great Renaissance scholastic Jacopo Zabarella suggests that the various partial substantial forms of a body regulate the proportion of elements found in that particular part of the body (De rebus naturalibus col. 396). (Or might indeed the form just be the proportion?) These are simply early moves in the decentralizing program that has taken us all the way through Descartes's nearly complete decoupling of soul and body, and on to modern biology where the locus of explanation lies at the level of cellular genetics.

Ward briefly notes that Scotus's account would have a long afterlife in scholastic thought (80n), but his discussion sometimes fails to recognize the diversity of options available within the framework he does so much to uncover. Ward contends, for instance, that only the proponent of Scotus's partial forms can treat the integral parts of a substance as themselves substances -- as if a hand, for instance, can count as a substance only if it has its own dedicated substantial form (166-68). But this cannot be right. Even Aquinas, the very strictest of unitarians, thinks that a hand is a substance (Summa theol. 1a 75.2 ad 1), and I know of not a single scholastic author who thought otherwise. After all, what else could a hand be? The Aristotelian categorial scheme allows only substances and accidents, and a hand is certainly not an accident. Perhaps Ward's idea is that, without partial forms to actualize the parts of a body, those parts do not actually exist. But bodies must have parts, if only because the standard scholastic definition of a body is as that which has partes extra partes.

Ward also misses the possibility that even a unitarian might endorse Scotus's partial forms. Francisco Suárez, for instance, insists on Aquinas's unitarian framework for living bodies, arguing that the same soul actualizes both the body and the body's various psychological capacities. But still he finds Scotus's decentralizing strategy compelling, and so Suárez treats the unique soul of a living thing as a composite of the various partial forms that animate the parts of the body (Metaphysical Disputations 15.10.30). This is exactly how Ward understands Scotus, but now transposed into a unitarian framework. (It has to be added, however, that Suárez cannot bring himself to apply this approach to the human soul, which he treats as simple and so holenmerically extended throughout the body.)

So it is, as I remarked at the start, only a rather narrow window that Ward opens up for us. Yet even so, it is a considerable achievement to have opened it, and what lies beyond this window is a very wide field indeed of underexplored possibilities.


Cross, Richard. The Physics of Duns Scotus: The Scientific Context of a Theological Vision (Oxford: Clarendon, 1998).

Francisco Suárez. On the Formal Cause of Substance: Metaphysical Disputation XV, tr. J. Kronen and J. Reedy (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 2000).

Jacopo Zabarella. De rebus naturalibus libri xxx (Frankfurt, 1607; repr. Frankfurt: Minerva, 1966).

Pasnau, Robert. Metaphysical Themes 1274-1671 (Oxford: Clarendon, 2011).

Thomas Aquinas. Basic Works, ed. J. Hause and R. Pasnau (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2014).

[1] Ward singles out for criticism Richard Cross, The Physics of Duns Scotus, pp. 68-71. I myself reached the same conclusion as Cross in Metaphysical Themes, pp. 630-31. That study discusses in more detail many of the issues I touch briefly on here.