John Locke and Natural Philosophy

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Peter R. Anstey, John Locke and Natural Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2011, 252pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199589777.

Reviewed by Jan-Erik Jones, Southern Virginia University


Peter Anstey's John Locke and Natural Philosophy is a masterful and well-argued study of Locke's philosophy of science that shall become both the standard and starting place, for scholars and students alike, for decades to come. Anstey's meticulous and thorough research, combined with his comprehensive knowledge of the history of natural philosophy, make this work a must-read for all who are interested in Locke, early modern philosophy, the history of the philosophy of science, or early modern philosophy of science. His characteristically rigorous analysis and argumentation coupled with his easy and clear prose make this a highly readable and accessible work of scholarship. In short, I highly recommend this book.

Anstey begins with the claim that John Locke's writings on natural philosophy have in many cases been "poorly interpreted and that a new approach is required." (p. 2) Some of the reasons for the shortcomings of previous interpretations are gaps in the manuscript material previously available, developments in Locke's own thoughts on natural philosophy that have not yet been fully appreciated, and the fact that some of the relevant texts have not been available in a reliable form until recently. For these reasons, Anstey argues, a study of Locke's views on natural philosophy must begin afresh.

Anstey's general organizing principle for his monograph is the distinction between experimental and speculative natural philosophies. Early modern experimental natural philosophy is characterized both by its focus on experiment and observation, and by its opposition to -- or limited and cautious application of -- hypotheses in the explanation of natural phenomena. For experimental natural philosophy, hypotheses must always be tethered to the observations. By contrast, speculative philosophy is characterized by its systematic adherence to speculative hypotheses to explain all natural phenomena while disregarding experiment and observation, or subordinating them to speculative hypotheses. For Anstey, understanding this contrast of approaches to natural philosophy in the seventeenth century is crucial to understanding the development of Locke's views, simply because during the late 1680s this division and associated tensions were forever altered by the publication of Newton's Principia.

Anstey's thesis is that Newton's work in natural philosophy constituted a new mathematical approach to experimental philosophy that not only radically changed how natural philosophy was to be practiced, but also influenced Locke's own views on the relationship among speculative hypotheses, principles, observation, and experimentation after the publication of the first edition of The Essay Concerning Human Understanding (hereafter, Essay). As he puts it,

when he composed the Essay, Locke believed that the method of natural history is the most appropriate and efficacious one for pursuing knowledge of the natural world. At this point, Locke was generally negatively disposed to admitting any role for principles or maxims in natural philosophy and emphasized the massive task of fact gathering for the enterprise of constructing natural histories. However, as Newton's achievement slowly dawned on him, he became aware of the efficacy of reasoning demonstratively by using principles; that is, he became aware that mathematical reasoning from principles derived from experience could generate knowledge of nature. (p. 152)

According to Anstey, then, Locke's odyssey from Baconian natural histories to Newtonian speculative principles (grounded in experience) began after he started to grasp the full force of Newton's accomplishments. For this reason, he argues, through understanding Locke's early focus on experimental natural philosophy and contrasting it with his later views, we can see how profoundly his positions changed and why the later Locke adopted the positions he did on explanation, knowledge, and speculative hypotheses and principles. In the end, I believe that Anstey has made a strong case for his general thesis. We have long known that Newton's work influenced Locke, but Anstey's critical look at the development of Locke's views gives us a new, clear and systematic interpretation of just how Newton affected Locke.

A brief look at the table of contents reveals that the book is structured around an interpretation of Locke's Essay, but it then takes up each of the central subtopics within early modern natural philosophy and shows how Anstey's reading of Locke is borne out in how Locke approached each of these subtopics. I should also point out that John Locke and Natural Philosophy is in no way limited to the Essay as the source of the interpretation. Anstey brings his nearly encyclopedic knowledge of Locke's life, education, interests, associations, published and unpublished manuscripts, notebooks, letters and commonplace books to bear on how he interprets Locke's natural philosophy. In particular, Anstey's familiarity with Locke's work in botany and medicine allows him to paint a much more complete and unified picture of the philosopher than we have heretofore seen in similarly ambitious studies. Moreover, he fleshes-out a novel developmental story of Locke's career that is both rooted in the best evidence available and orients his work within the context of the other great works of his period that helps show us why Locke was -- and remains -- one of the towering intellectual figures of human history.

Some of the chapters focus on issues that have become de rigueur for any discussion of Locke, e.g., chapter 1, "Natural philosophy and the aims of the Essay"; chapter 2, "Corpuscular pessimism"; chapter 3, "Natural history"; chapter 4, "Hypotheses and analogy"; chapter 8, "Explanation"; and chapter 11, "Species". However, I was very much cheered to see that Anstey also included full chapters on material that is not as frequently singled out for discussion in Locke, e.g., chapter 6, "Mathematics"; chapter 7, "Demonstration"; chapter 9, "Iatrochemistry"; and chapter 10, "Generation".

While every chapter contains a novel addition to the literature, some of the highlights for me included chapters on natural history, mathematics, demonstration, generation and species. For example, in chapter 3, "Natural History", Anstey draws on a wide array of letters, notes and published and unpublished works to argue that Locke's thought on natural philosophy was deeply influenced by Bacon and Baconians. Most monographs on Locke make the perfunctory mention of Locke's connections with Robert Boyle and his study of Bacon and natural histories; in this chapter, however, Anstey takes care to produce the evidence for these claims. He shows us Locke's scholarly involvement with natural histories in what he read and what he wrote. He shows evidence of Locke's twenty-five-year involvement in constructing natural histories in his work with Boyle on The General History of the Air. By the end of the chapter, it becomes very clear that natural histories are more than an academic interest to Locke. Moreover, it is in this chapter that Anstey's thesis concerning Locke's development from Baconian natural histories to Newtonian speculative principles is brought clearly to the fore.

One of the main achievements of the work is Anstey's novel account of Locke's views on mathematics, demonstration, and demonstrative knowledge and how they connect to Locke's unique natural philosophy. In chapter 6, entitled "Mathematics", Anstey traces the development of Locke's thoughts on mathematics, and along the way he connects them to the introduction of modes and essences in the Essay.

One issue he addresses in this chapter concerns the interpretation of mathematical objects in Locke. Are mathematical objects ideal (purely mind-dependent) entities, or are they concrete objects and our ideas of them are derived from experience of external reality? Anstey argues that the claims in the Essay that mathematical knowledge is both real and instructive provide us an answer to this question. For Locke, 'real knowledge' conforms to reality while 'instructive knowledge' conveys new, nontrivial, information. So, how are we to make sense of mathematical knowledge being instructive and conforming with reality? According to Anstey, when Locke claims that mathematical knowledge conforms to reality, he is saying that our complex ideas of mathematical objects possess the same properties their corresponding objects in the physical world have. According to Anstey, Locke is also committed to the view that the real essences of mathematical objects exist (mind-independently) in space. In other words, our ideas of triangles possess the properties of triangles in the world and the real essences of our ideas of triangles are spatial objects. (pp.124-5) Mathematical knowledge is thus instructive and real because it tells us about the way things are. Along the way to this interesting and provocative conclusion, Anstey's exegetical work on archetypes, infinity, real essences of modes and the identity of the real and nominal essences of modes contributes important insights to the current literature on these topics that rewards careful study.

In chapter 7, entitled "Demonstration", Anstey develops a unique interpretation of Locke on demonstrative knowledge that connects our ability to acquire mathematical knowledge with his account of natural philosophy. Locke's method of demonstration was a radical departure from the scholastic syllogistic approach. Demonstrative knowledge, for Locke, is not the conclusion of a valid syllogism, but consists in the apprehension, or to use Locke's term, intuition, of an intermediate idea that connects two other ideas. Demonstration is grounded in perceptions of relations among ideas. In this way, Anstey points out, Locke has modified logic in a way that affects subsequent generations.

It is in this new logical method that Anstey finds more evidence for his general claim of the influence of Newton on Locke. Locke's first edition of the Essay (published in December, 1689) contains a sustained critique of the "futility of basing our knowledge or our opinions [in natural philosophy] upon general principles and maxims." (p. 148) But, Anstey points out, Locke's position on this changes in the 1690s. By the publication of Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693) and the fourth edition of the Essay (1700), Locke has accepted the view that demonstrations from basic principles in natural philosophy are perfectly legitimate, so long as the principles are justified by observation or experiment.

The key to this about-face in Locke's thinking is plausibly linked to Newton's success in using principles founded in experience to ground his demonstrations in physics. Indeed, Anstey argues, in 1690 Newton sent Locke a copy of his "A Demonstration That the Planets by their gravity towards the sun may move in Ellipses", and it is after this that Locke adds the caveat that principles in natural philosophy are acceptable if they are "principles that matters of fact justifie." (p. 149) So, even though Locke revises the logic of demonstration in mathematics and natural philosophy, he retains the traditional commitment to mathematical demonstration as the model of reasoning in natural philosophy, so long as the principles at the bottom are grounded in experience.

Another highlight of the work is Anstey's argument for Locke as a metaphysical realist about species. In chapters 10 and 11, Anstey argues that while Locke was clearly a conventionalist about the classification of species by humans, he was a realist about natural kinds. His argument in chapter 11, entitled "Species", is a familiar one based on standard assumptions about the causal relationship between real and nominal essences.[1] To my mind, however, the most important contribution to the literature on Locke's natural kind realism in the last decade is made in chapter 10, entitled "Generation".

In chapter 10, Anstey argues that Locke adopts a version of species realism based on considerations of generation and seeds, or seminal principles. By his lights, Locke accepted a seminal principle theory of generation of kinds at least as early as Draft A of the Essay and maintained it throughout his career. Some of the evidence for this conclusion comes in the discussion of resurrection in the section of chapter 10 entitled "Re-generation". There Anstey cites a pair of passages in Locke's second reply to Stillingfleet -- where the discussion centers on whether the resurrection of the dead is of the numerically same body that was laid down in the grave or the receipt of a new body -- as evidence that Locke thought that propagation by seeds preserves the same species. Here are the two quotations he gives:

(1) in the production of wheat and other grain from seeds, God continued every species distinct: so that from grains of wheat sown, root, stalk, blade, ear, and grains, of wheat, were produced, and not those of barley; and so of the rest: which I took to be the meaning of 'to every seed his own body'. (Works, vol. IV, p. 317; Anstey p. 201)

(2) For I do not know of any seminal body in little, contained in the dead carcass of any man or woman; which, as your lordship says, in seeds, having its proper organical parts, shall afterwards be enlarged, and at the resurrection grow up into the same man. For I never thought of any seed or seminal parts, either of plant or animal, 'so wonderfully improved by the providence of God', whereby the same plant or animal should beget itself; nor ever heard, that it was by divine Providence designed to produce the same individual, but for the producing of future and distinct individuals, for the continuation of the same species. (Ibid.)

If Anstey is right that Locke held the view that species are naturally generated by seminal principles, then the conclusion that Locke is a natural kind realist follows quite readily. On the other hand, while there are other arrows in his quiver, there are reasons to suspect that these texts might not support Anstey's conclusion.

I grant that these are problematic texts for Anstey's critics, however, there is a plausible alternative reading available. In (1) we see Locke employing an analogy with plants to indicate that 'same' refers to the numerically same body and not to a reproduction. Surely it is possible to employ an analogy without being ontologically committed to either of the analogues. Since Stillingfleet is a species realist, and a believer that wheat seeds produce only wheat and not barley, then surely Locke's employment of that analogy could be seen as targeted at convincing his interlocutor, not to declare that Locke himself is a realist about species. So the context of that passage is tricky and does not, on its own, settle the case in the affirmative for Anstey.

My case against (2) is similar. It is plausible to argue that when Locke says "I never thought of any seed or seminal parts", and "nor ever heard that it was by divine Providence", he seems not to be adopting a realist position, but rather to be disavowing a pair of claims. That is, he is disavowing both (i) the idea that a seed within the corpse can be made into a copy of the person's body and that is what is meant by 'resurrection of the same body'; and (ii) that it is part of the theoretical role of 'seeds' to be a part of an account of resurrection (theoretically, all seeds are supposed to explain is generation, not regeneration). But surely Locke can make these statements without being a realist about species.

So to say that (1) and (2) support the claim that Locke is a species realist because he invokes the concepts of seeds and seminal principles is a stretch of the context; that does not appear to be the point that he is making. Moreover, it requires us to take at face value a set of claims that are highly nuanced and set within a very complex dialectic, made worse by Locke's famously cagey rhetoric within the Stillingfleet correspondence. So, while I find Anstey's account of species realism in Locke to be strong, challenging, and an ingenious addition to the literature, I believe it still needs some shoring-up.

Since it would be misleading and impolite to end a review of such an important book with criticism and nit-picking, I shall instead end with the reminder that I find this book a highly readable and important contribution to the scholarly work on Locke, and I believe that it shall set the standard for scholarship on Locke's natural philosophy for years to come.

[1] For a complete account of my arguments against Anstey's realist position in Chapter 11, see my "Locke on Real Essences, Intelligibility and Natural Kinds", Journal of Philosophical Research, vol. 35 (2010), pp. 147-172. Though Anstey's chapter is not mentioned in this paper, the crux of his case in Ch. 11 is addressed.