John Locke and Personal Identity: Immortality and Bodily Resurrection in 17th-Century Philosophy

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K. Joanna S. Forstrom, John Locke and Personal Identity: Immortality and Bodily Resurrection in 17th-Century Philosophy, Continuum, 2010, 154pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847061454.

Reviewed by Shelley Weinberg, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


Since its appearance in the second edition of the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke's theory of personal identity has faced numerous objections, some of which have yet to be fully satisfied. Forstrom's John Locke and Personal Identity attempts to address several of those objections from a new vantage point. Forstrom considers Locke's account of personal identity in relation to four seventeenth-century philosophical accounts of personal immortality, bodily resurrection, and the afterlife: Cartesian dualism, Hobbesian materialism, Cambridge Platonism, and Boyle's corpuscularian mechanism. Forstrom's aim is to "modif[y] the standard account of Locke on personal identity into the problematic of personal immortality and bodily resurrection" (29). The main claim of the book is that seeing Locke's treatment of personal identity this way sheds new light on how to answer longstanding objections to the theory.

The book is composed of six chapters, one on each of Locke's contemporaries and two on Locke. In general, I think the work will be of most interest to those looking for a brief expository survey of contrasting positions taken on the nature and immortality of the soul and how various theological commitments required for a theory of divine justice are met. Those more familiar with these issues in general, and Locke's theory in particular, are likely to find it less useful. The two chapters on Locke lack the depth of analysis scholars working in the field are likely to expect, especially considering the influence of Locke's theory and the volume of scholarship dedicated to it. As is customary, I will summarize the chapters before I offer some critical remarks concerning the arguments presented to justify the core thesis of the book.

Chapter II.xxvii, on Identity and Diversity, was added to the second edition of the Essay at the urging of William Molyneux. Forstrom suggests that Molyneux's interest might have been to encourage Locke to address some of the stickier issues that arise with the dual commitment to personal immortality and bodily resurrection (the former focusing on the soul and the latter on the body) that had been the backdrop of much medieval concern with philosophical issues of individuation and identity (9). The guiding question is what constitutes the individuation and diachronic identity of a person, given that a system of public and divine justice works only if we can be suitably concerned for a pleasant afterlife. Receptivity to this concern, Forstrom suggests, may be one reason why Locke is concerned to show that whatever constitutes the diachronic identity of a person, it cannot be merely substance with no consciousness of its own thinking and acting (14).

In the first chapter, Forstrom sets up the discussion with an outline of Locke's theory of personal identity, including Locke's distinction between the principle of individuation and the conditions for diachronic identity. Individuals are distinguished by the beginning of their existence, and they continue as the same thing as long as they satisfy the identity condition for the kind of thing they are. In the case of persons, the identity condition is consciousness. "In short, the existence of a person is the existence of a consciousness, and the continued existence of that person is the continued existence of that consciousness" (24). In answer to the question whether I am the same person across time, Forstrom explains,

When I ask myself 'Am I the same person as I was yesterday?' the answer comes from a comparison of my idea of self now at t2 with my idea of self yesterday at t1. If I am the same person today as yesterday, then I am the same person who did the actions of yesterday and so am responsible for those actions today (24).

In addition, Forstrom cites the ability to "appropriate or remember" an action as the criterion for being responsible for that action (25). She says, "Consciousness is the focus, and the appropriation of past actions to itself. If an action is appropriated then the punishment or reward is merited. If the action is not appropriated, then the punishment is not merited" (28). The main virtues of the interpretation, she argues, is that it allows for a focus on the continuity of a moral self and on the concern for a future self, and it is consistent with Locke's theological commitments to a theory of divine rectification (divine justice) and bodily resurrection.

Chapters 2-5 address issues of immortality and bodily resurrection in Descartes, Hobbes, More, and Boyle. Forstrom focuses on Descartes's arguments for the distinction between the soul and the body and their ramifications for personal immortality. Arguing that the soul is really distinct from the body is meant to establish the view that the soul can exist without the body, which, along with the assurance from revelation that God will not annihilate souls, philosophically bolsters the theological commitment to immortality. This discussion is offered as a preface to the main point of the chapter, which is that Locke's account of personal identity is in many ways responding directly to Descartes's dualist ontology in combination with the empirical fact that we are mind/body composites. Thus, in II.xxvii, we find Locke establishing that consciousness must be the criterion for personal identity. Otherwise, there can be various scenarios in which souls and bodies come apart and reunite such that were the identity of the person located exclusively with the soul or the body we would be hard pressed to find an intuitively satisfactory account of moral responsibility that is sensitive to personal identity. Forstrom suggests that, in contrast to Descartes, Locke is concerned to show that immortality "is the continued identity of a moral agent, a person who is rightly or wrongly punished for actions done" (52). Therefore, an account of immortality that focuses only on issues of individuation and identity of the soul is insufficient (52). Locke's response to Descartes, according to Forstrom, is that an account of personal identity cannot be merely consistent with theological commitments to immortality and bodily resurrection, but must also provide what is important to morality, namely the psychological continuity of a moral agent.

Chapter 3 outlines Hobbes's "mechanistic materialism" and his apparent theological commitment to "mortalism", the theological doctrine that at death the body goes to sleep and is resurrected at some later time. There is some scholarly dispute over whether Hobbes's commitment to mortalism follows from his mechanistic materialism or is meant to bolster his political views, but the important upshot seems to be that, in either case, Hobbes found it necessary to deny the immortality of the soul. The important consequence of this denial and its influence on Locke, Forstrom argues, is that bodily resurrection must be taken into account when we are thinking about issues of individuation and identity. Forstrom continues that both Hobbes and Locke consider "persons" to be moral agents who are subject to bodily resurrection. Forstrom concludes that what Locke learned from Hobbes is that if a materialist theory of personal identity is going to be responsive to divine justice, then whatever persists must be able to remember what it did in this life. She concludes that "if a person were a material substance, then an individual would be held by God responsible for actions he could not remember" (75). The challenge Hobbes sets for Locke is seen as how best to account for moral responsibility and divine justice given a commitment to materialism.

The fourth chapter moves to a discussion of the influence on Locke of Henry More and Cambridge Platonism generally. This influence is seen as mostly negative in that Locke wants to show that we can account for the identity of persons without resolving the question of the nature or immortality of the soul (76, 97). Here, Forstrom argues that Locke is responding to both More and Hobbes by denying that the continued existence of either the soul or the body is the criterion for personal identity. The reason is that Locke is agnostic about whether matter can be made to think, and he is clear that we need not have a philosophical proof of the immateriality of the soul to secure morality (IV.iii.6). Forstrom also argues (99) that Locke is responding to More's view that we will suffer divine rewards and punishments even though we have no awareness of what we have done. Here, we see again the themes of what can be said to survive death and the role of memory in personhood and moral responsibility. Forstrom concludes that "what Locke draws from this is that personal identity, or the identity of a responsible moral agent, is not found in substances. Rather, it is found in consciousness and the appropriation of actions to one's self" (100). After all, asserts Forstrom, God can restore to us, whether we are material or immaterial, whatever memories are necessary in order to be punished justly. Therefore, Locke's move to a psychological account of personal identity, in which the appropriation of past actions is the sole criterion, should be seen as a direct response to previously held views of what constitutes personal immortality.

Finally, in the fifth chapter, Forstrom considers Robert Boyle's influence on Locke. Forstrom's main claim is that Locke moves beyond Boyle by changing the focus from bodily resurrection to resurrection of the dead, which is consistent with a focus on personal immortality and "what it takes for an individual to be a moral agent and to be held responsible as a moral agent at the last Judgment" (115). This shift, she claims, also allows Locke to extricate himself from a commitment "to a particular analysis of matter or substance or to a particular theological school" (114) when it comes to developing his theory of personal identity.

The exposition of various historical treatments of what survives death and whether it is enough to do the work required in a theory of divine justice is meant to motivate the view that Locke is interested in crafting a theory of personal identity that is sensitive to these same issues. Regardless of whether in fact Locke is responding to his contemporaries, it is uncontroversial, I think, that Locke was concerned to put forward a theory that is consistent with his agnosticism about the nature of thinking substance and his theological commitment to divine rectification. But Forstrom draws a much stronger conclusion. She argues, I think unsuccessfully, that seeing Locke's theory as primarily concerned with personal immortality and divine justice also solves three well-known objections historically lodged against Locke's view. These are the failure of transitivity, circularity, and the lack of care for a future self. I'll consider only Forstrom's treatment of the circularity problem in any detail although I think at least her solution to the transitivity problem is vulnerable to the same objection.

The circularity problem, as first noted by Samuel Butler in The Analogy of Religion, is that if personal identity is constituted by memory, then we are already supposing an identical self to know. That is, there must be something metaphysical that memory tracks. Forstrom answers the objection by arguing that Locke sees the appropriation of memory as sufficient for personal identity. There is no metaphysical claim. She points to the distinction between civil and divine justice and Locke's own claims in II.xxvii.13 that the goodness of God ensures that divine justice will rectify any mistakes in appropriations, like false memory, made in this life. Where in civil cases there must be an appeal to factual evidence, say where my body was during the commission of the crime, on the day of judgment God can simply reveal to me what I really have done, so that my final appropriations are correct (125-127). Forstrom is arguing that Locke's commitment to divine justice shows that he has a purely epistemic theory of personal identity and thus does not commit circularity.

Forstrom makes a similar argument in the first chapter. She cites Locke's II.xxvii.22 example of the drunkard who has no consciousness of having committed a particular act. Although the drunkard cannot remember or appropriate her actions, she is nevertheless punished by a civil court, since the court has no way of knowing whether a loss of consciousness reflects that the action was in fact committed by someone else. Note the parallel to the case of appropriating a false memory. She then argues that Locke's commitment to divine justice is what really matters, since on judgment day God can restore the drunkard's memories. Human epistemic limitations and the moral responsibility that erroneously follows are made up for in the afterlife. I think Forstrom is clearly right that as long as Locke's criterion for personal identity is a first-personal appropriation of mental states, there is no circularity.

The problem that Forstrom fails to see, however, is that as long as the correct determination of responsibility (which in Locke's case tracks sameness of person) issues from the first-personal point of view, there is no epistemic difference between a civil court and a divine one. That is, just as the civil court must look to factual evidence, such as the presence of my body at the scene of the crime, God must also have something objective to look to in order to know what I have actually done when I don't remember. But unless there is something that continues to exist that can be known from a third-personal point of view, there is nothing for God to look to in determining which memories should be restored to which person. So, the claimed epistemic difference between the cases of civil and divine justice doesn't succeed in supporting Forstrom's claim that Locke's account avoids circularity. Nor can Forstrom use it as support for her general thesis that Locke's account of personal identity is securely tied to his theological commitment to personal immortality and bodily resurrection. The reason is that the consciousness of past actions is not enough to ensure just (civil or divine) punishment. Now, this is not to deny that Locke has these theological commitments and that a coherent theory of personal identity would have to be consistent with them. It is only to show that the evidence cited by Forstrom does not in fact support her claim.

Forstrom makes the same mistake, I believe, in her proposed resolution to Reid's famous objection that Locke's theory of personal identity fails the logic of transitivity. In short, she fails to see that the appeal to divine rectification is insufficient to overcome failures in our ability to appropriate to ourselves all we have done. My worry is that her failure to appreciate this problem is due to her lack of careful engagement with other significant scholarship on Locke, since it raises just this issue. Here I am thinking primarily of John Mackie and especially Kenneth Winkler's influential arguments that Locke has an appropriation theory of personal identity. But also missing are acknowledgements, even in the bibliography, of other very important scholarship offering philosophical analyses and interpretive solutions to many of the same issues Forstrom is addressing. Some of the especially unfortunate oversights include work by Margaret Atherton, William Alston and Jonathan Bennett, Vere Chappell, Edwin McCann, William Uzgalis, and Gideon Yaffe.