John Locke's Politics of Moral Consensus

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Greg Forster, John Locke's Politics of Moral Consensus, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 328pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521842182.

Reviewed by Vere Chappell, University of Massachusetts


The aim of this book, its author says, is "to reintroduce the historically accurate Locke into the discourse of political theory, with his religious views intact, in a way that shows his continuing relevance to politics in our own time"(5). Forster thus sets himself two tasks. The first is to provide an account of Locke's thought that is historically accurate. The second is to establish that Locke's thought is relevant to politics in our own time.

Despite the title, the book is not confined to Locke's political thought. Forster surveys Locke's epistemology, his ethical theory, and his philosophy of religion, as well as his political philosophy. He focuses primarily on the works in which Locke's "mature thought" is expressed: the Essay, the Letter Concerning Toleration, and the Reasonableness of Christianity, as well as the Two Treatises. The philosophy contained in these four works, Forster contends, has a "coherent architecture"; it constitutes a single "system" of thought, that is, a "set of mutually consistent arguments that fit together to form a unified philosophic structure". During the time that he was writing these works, Forster contends, Locke had an overriding "political project", which was to "unite members of different religious groups into a single political community". The only way to do this, Forster believes (and claims that Locke believed), is by establishing a moral consensus, a set of shared normative convictions and commitments which will "justify the coercive rules that are the only hope of keeping a multireligious society from falling apart at the seams". So Locke's aim in these works was to "construct a moral theory that can accomplish this goal".

Forster concedes that Locke "never explicitly acknowledged any single intellectual project uniting his major works", nor did he describe his works as "forming a unified philosophic system, and … [he] may not even have intended that they would ultimately fit together in this way". Nonetheless, Forster maintains, the works "are all addressed to coping with the same problem … and there are no significant conflicts between the positions taken in the various works". For this reason, "there is a natural intellectual confluence" among them, and "a unified system of thought arises from this confluence". It is this unified system that Forster refers to as "Locke's theory of moral consensus".

One might wonder how an account of a philosopher's thought that attributes to him a project he never mentions, and intentions he never expresses, can be "historically accurate". Forster is more convincing, however, when he views Locke's work from a less Olympian prospect and sticks more closely to what the texts actually say. He is particularly illuminating when he lays out the details of Locke's political and religious philosophy in Two Treatises, Letter Concerning Toleration, The Reasonableness of Christianity, and Book IV of the Essay.

In elaborating the theory of moral consensus that he finds in Locke's major works, Forster maintains that Locke accepts the following propositions (among others; the words quoted are Forster's.)

(1) Our [sc. Locke's] times are fraught with social conflict, caused mainly by differences of belief and practice among different religious groups.

(2) Political consensus requires moral consensus. "The fundamental reason that English society [in the 17th century] was coming apart at the seams was … because it could not agree on what moral theory should be the basis of … government action" (17).

(3) Morality is grounded in religion. "All moral concerns are ultimately derived from God's command" (15). "Religion is the ultimate arbitrator of morality" (29).

(4) That God exists is the indispensable core of all religion, and all religious believers in our [sc. Locke's] time accept it.

(5) That God exists can be rationally demonstrated, and so is absolutely certain; its "evidence is 'equal to mathematical certainty' (E IV.10.1, 619)" (101). "… the ultimate foundation of religion for Locke, as for Aquinas, is logical proof that God exists" (103).

(6) Other propositions accepted by religious believers are less certain than the proposition that God exists, but they may have some degree of certainty, and in any case need not be irrational, that is, against reason.

(7) "… it is possible for a person to be both fully rational and a religious believer at the same time" (26).

(8) Religious believers (in our [sc. Locke's] time) either are rational, or they can be taught or persuaded to become rational. Hence they not only do or can be brought to accept that God exists; but they can be brought to tolerate differences among people's other religious beliefs. "… there is hope that religious people can be persuaded that fanaticism and violence are against God's wishes, and that people of different faiths can share a common rational community" (26).

(9) All it takes for a society to achieve moral and hence political consensus is for all or most of its members both to believe in the existence of God and to tolerate differences in people's other religious beliefs.

Note that some of these propositions (namely (3), (5), (6), and (7)) express philosophical doctrines or positions; others (namely, (1), (2), (4), (8), and (9)) concern matters of historical, sociological, or psychological fact. Forster is on solid ground when he attributes the former to Locke, since he can cite (and often does cite) actual texts in support of doing so. His assurance that Locke accepted the factual propositions is less well grounded, but the general tenor of Locke's writings, together with well-known facts about his life and conduct, make it reasonable to believe that he did.

Overall, then, Forster does a decent job of interpreting Locke's thought, especially when he concentrates on matters about which Locke actually expresses opinions. And even when his proposals are somewhat speculative, they are interesting and thought-provoking.

Forster's performance of his second task, however, which is to show that Locke's theory of moral consensus is relevant to "politics in our own time", is less impressive.

Forster's argument here has two parts (though he does not explicitly distinguish them). In the first he endorses Locke's theory of moral consensus, including all the propositions stated above, sometimes presenting explicit arguments of his own for their truth, sometimes taking Locke's word for them or simply assuming that they are true.

Second, Forster puts forward some further propositions, which are designed to connect Locke's society with our society today. Among these further propositions are the following:

(10) Our society is like Locke's in that his theory of moral consensus, designed for the latter, applies to the former as well. "Locke's time is not so radically different from ours that [he] has nothing to teach us … at the level of practical content" (18). "Our moment in history is … similar to Locke's on a … specific, short-term level, as the specter of mass violence motivated by religious conflict has recently become the most prominent item on the world agenda" (22).

(11) Locke's theory of moral consensus was effective in establishing peace and reducing the level of religious intolerance in his time. "There is considerably less optimism today [than there was in Locke's time] about building moral consensus through reason, but there shouldn't be … . the popularity of Locke's ideas in his own time and the success of liberalism in the centuries that followed largely vindicated Locke's optimism. The prospects for peace and mutual toleration among conflicting social groups were far more dismal in seventeenth-century England than they are anywhere in the developed world today, and yet Locke's attempt to make peace and promote toleration can only be judged a spectacular success" (34).

(12) The core doctrine, that God exists, or at least that "a divine power exists in the universe", was not only held in common by "every religious group in Locke's England, but [is accepted by] virtually all religious groups everywhere" (31).

The trouble with Foster's argument is twofold. First, none of the propositions that Forster takes over from Locke is unassailable. The evidence for those that deal with factual matters is uncertain at best: how do we know that religious fanatics in Locke's time were capable of becoming rational through teaching and persuasion? That Locke thought they were is one thing; that in fact they were, as Forster thinks as well, is quite another. As for the philosophical opinions that Forster attributes to Locke, at least two of them -- namely, (3), concerning the foundation of morality, and (7), concerning the rationality of religion, are now widely disputed, and were controversial even in Locke's day. Yet, Forster provides no argument for the superiority of Locke's opinions to other views that have been favored by philosophers: Utilitarianism and Kantianism, for example, as opposed to Locke's divine command theory of morality; fideism and Kierkegaardian irrationalism as opposed to rationalism regarding the nature of religion. (Forster does make one reference to Kantian theory, but not a very illuminating one: Kantians such as Rawls, he says, "recognize the need to justify [the] principles [of equality and freedom] … but they tend … to smother [the problem] in a dense fog of misappropriated pseudo-Kantian jargon" (260).) Furthermore, Locke's argument for the existence of God, on whose alleged success both Locke and Foster base their view that God's existence is demonstrable, is flatly fallacious.

The fallacy in Locke's argument for the existence of God (or at least one fallacy) has been noted by readers of the Essay since Leibniz. The argument starts with two premises that are unassailable, that "there is some real Being" and that "Non-entity cannot produce any real Being". From these two premises, Locke concludes (validly, if the second premise is properly interpreted)that (A) "From eternity there has been something" (Essay IV.x.3). Then in the next paragraph he refers to "This eternal Source … of all being", as if the argument so far entitles him to hold that (B) one single being has existed from eternity. Perhaps he thinks that (B) is merely a restatement of (A), that the two have the same meaning; or perhaps he thinks that (B) follows from (A). If the former, Locke's fallacy is that of equivocation, since (B) and (A) do not have the same meaning; if the latter, then he is simply mistaken about the logical relation between (A) and (B). (Contemporary logicians would say that in either case, Locke gets from (A) to (B) by switching the order of the two quanitifiers that are implicit in both).

Not only is Forster unaware of this (or any other) fallacy in Locke's argument, he commits it himself in restating the argument: "If anything has ever existed, something must have always existed, eternally, from which that thing was created" (102). Slightly paraphrased, this becomes: "If at all times there is something that exists, then there must be something that exists at all times". And if the fallacy is still not apparent, then compare: "If everybody loves somebody, then somebody must be loved by everybody." The upshot is not, of course, that God does not exist, but that Locke's argument provides no rational basis for believing that God does, or for thinking that the existence of God is certain.

The second part of Forster's argument for the "continuing relevance of Locke's philosophy to politics in our own time" includes acceptance of the three "further propositions" ((9)-(11)) set forth above. These too are propositions that have factual, as opposed to philosophical, import. And here again, Forster cites little evidence to support them. Indeed, most people's experience and observation nowadays would lead them to think the contrary. While there is no disputing that "the specter of mass violence motivated by religious conflict has recently become the most prominent item on the world agenda", is our society "similar to Locke's" regarding the level and the nature of the violence that prevails in the world today? And is it true that "the prospects for peace and mutual toleration among conflicting social groups" today are even comparable to what they were in Locke's time, much less "far [less] dismal" than they? Locke had warring armies wielding swords against one other, and there were economic losses on the part of non-combatants. But we have terrorist acts whose targets are non-combatants; we have suicide-bombers and burnings of mosques and temples with worshipers inside; and even in America we have attacks on abortion clinics, and the murder of individually targeted physicians, perpetrated by our own citizens.

Furthermore, even if Forster is right in thinking that it was Locke's work that was responsible for the prevalence of peace and toleration in eighteenth-century England (such as it was), would any well-informed observer believe that "building moral consensus through reason", or by reflecting on what different religions have in common, is likely to have the same result now?

Finally, is it true that the different religions whose adherents are killing each other now do have anything in common? Do they all accept, in particular, the "core doctrine" that God exists? All the members of the contending groups in Locke's England did accept this doctrine: they were all monotheists, indeed all Christians, and most were Protestant Christians. In today's world, however, not all religious believers are monotheists (though some of the most violent are: Muslim, Jews, and Christians): some are polytheists (Hindus) and some are atheists (Buddhists).

It is true that Forster sometimes qualifies his claim (though Locke does not qualify his), in two ways. First, he says the core doctrine is not that God but that "a divine power" exists. But this power, as Foster conceives it, is still a power that has knowledge, will, and moral authority, and that is not a power that Hindus and Buddhists are likely to acknowledge.

Second, in one passage, Forster restricts the application of Locke's remedy for the religious violence that pervades in the world today to the "developed world" (this is on page 34). If this is what he meant all along, however, then his thesis may be true, but it loses much of its interest. Most of the recent "mass violence motivated by religious conflict" (22) has occurred in the developing, not the developed, world. In any case, this seems not to be what Forster meant all along.