John Locke: The Philosopher as Christian Virtuoso

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Victor Nuovo, John Locke: The Philosopher as Christian Virtuoso, Oxford University Press, 2017, 320pp., $70.00, ISBN 9780198800552.

Reviewed by Elliot Rossiter, Douglas College


Victor Nuovo’s book is the fruit of years of careful and thorough study of Locke’s theological writings. This book is the culmination of his prior substantial work on the theological and religious dimension of Locke’s thought. Nuovo’s key argument is that Locke should be understood as a “Christian virtuoso”: someone who sought to combine the new experimental natural philosophy (espoused especially within the Royal Society of London) with the commitment of a practicing Christian. According to Nuovo, it is important to understand Locke as a Christian virtuoso, for theological themes are present throughout all of his major works and can be helpful in seeing points of continuity and coherence between them.

The first three chapters of the book serve as background for framing Locke’s character as a Christian virtuoso within the broader intellectual context of science and religion in early-modern England. The first two chapters are devoted to Francis Bacon and Robert Boyle, both of whom are presented as forerunners of Christian virtuosity. The expression, ‘Christian virtuoso’, was coined by Boyle as a descriptor of a vocation wherein one harmonizes a deep commitment to both experimental natural philosophy and Christianity; Boyle develops the expression in a polemical context against detractors who see these pursuits as at odds with one another. The question of how to conceive of the relationship between Christianity and natural philosophy was, of course, greatly debated in seventeenth-century philosophy. Nuovo holds that Bacon’s view can be summarized according to ’Bacon’s Rule’, the principle that natural philosophy and theology should both be pursued independently of one another; this independence purifies natural philosophy of superstition and metaphysical fantasies while at the same time safeguarding the authority of divine revelation (13-15). Nuovo’s discussion of Bacon’s rule is useful in showing Bacon’s concern to preserve the integrity of both natural philosophy and theology.

In the second chapter, Nuovo argues that Bacon’s rule can also be used in understanding Boyle, especially in light of Boyle’s adoption of atomism; but I think that more needs to be done here to delineate the precise character of this rule, for there is an ambiguity in Nuovo’s presentation. There seems to me to be a weaker and a stronger sense of Bacon’s rule: the first involves a separation of speculative systems of metaphysics from natural philosophy, while the second involves a further separation of natural theology and teleology from natural philosophy. Self-described experimental philosophers generally all maintain a commitment to the weaker sense of the rule.1The stronger formulation, however, is a point of divergence between figures like Bacon and Descartes, who remove final causes from the study of nature, and figures like Boyle and Locke, who combine teleology and natural philosophy in holding that experimental philosophy gives direct evidence of divine providence.

Another way of making this point is to say that one could hold that natural philosophy supports divine providence either directly or indirectly. The direct position is that natural philosophy provides evidence of divine design in the natural world. The indirect position is that the practice of experimental natural philosophy disposes the mind to accept revelation by cultivating epistemic virtues like humility and attentiveness. Bacon, Boyle, and Locke are all committed to the indirect position, but diverge with respect to the direct position, while Bacon is committed to natural philosophy and theology being more independent of one another. While Nuovo is right to place Locke within the context of Bacon and Boyle, more needs to be said about teleology in delineating their respective positions regarding the relationship between natural philosophy and the Christian religion. In this vein, it would seem that there are plural senses in which one could identify as a Christian virtuoso.

In the third chapter, Nuovo provides an account of tensions surrounding Christian philosophy and the adoption of Epicureanism in the new natural philosophy of the seventeenth century. In its materialism and denial of final causes, Epicurean atomism entailed a rejection of divine creation and providence and threatened a ‘crisis of atheism’ (62). Epicureanism thus represented a formidable challenge for the Christian virtuoso. Moving beyond a simple treatment of canonical figures in the history of philosophy, Nuovo expands his analysis of tensions surrounding the reception of Epicureanism in early-modern England by looking at poet-translators of Lucretius’ De rerum natura, such as John Evelyn and Lucy Hutchinson, but also the libertine poet John Wilmot, the second Earl of Rochester. This chapter is commendable in blending both literary and philosophical concepts in a way that brings a depth and richness to the history of ideas that is often missing in more analytic treatments of the history of philosophy.

In the second part (chapters four to eight), Nuovo explicitly focuses on the character of Locke’s thought as that of a Christian virtuoso. Scholarly treatments of Locke’s philosophy can often falter by failing to ask the question of not just what Locke thought, but when he thought it. Nuovo, however, clearly demonstrates that Locke maintains an interest in theology not just in the last decade of his life, but throughout the course of his intellectual development. In the fourth chapter, he shows how the concerns of a Christian virtuoso are present in the drafts and notes preceding the publication of Locke’s Essay concerning Human Understanding. In the drafts, we find the basic ingredients of a logic of empirical discovery achieved experimentally — a logic that Locke takes to be of use to establishing principles of morality and revealed religion.

The fifth, sixth, and seventh chapters — logic, physics, and ethics — are organized around the threefold division of knowledge that Locke presents in the last chapter of the Essay (IV.xxi). Logic, or semiotics, considers the nature of signs that the mind uses in its understanding of things or communication of ideas (Essay IV.xxi.4). In the fifth chapter, Nuovo continues themes developed in the fourth chapter and argues that Locke’s Essay should be read as an experimental logic following a natural history of the mind. Locke’s exploration of the human understanding yields the conclusion that its scope is limited. According to Locke, human beings exist in a state of “mediocrity”: in the chain of being, we occupy a position between beasts and angels. One key limitation of our understanding is that we are unable to perceive the real essences of bodies; accordingly, a demonstrative natural philosophy is beyond our reach in this life. But there is, nonetheless, a certain felicity in this limitation: it encourages us to devote our attention to what is within the ken of our understanding, a knowledge of God’s existence and of our moral duties. I have argued elsewhere that this limitation is providential in Locke’s view since it directs us to our proper end in the pilgrimage of this life.2 Nuovo concludes the chapter by rightly emphasizing that Locke’s view is that morality, rather than natural philosophy, should be the proper focus of our understanding (Essay IV.xii.11). In the sixth chapter, he explores Locke’s speculative physics. He devotes the bulk of the chapter to an exposition and examination of the proof for God’s existence that Locke develops in IV.x of the Essay. According to Nuovo, Locke’s system of nature is theistic in being founded on a demonstration of the existence and attributes of God (152).

The final two chapters, respectively focused on ethics and theology, are continuous with each other regarding the theistic character of Locke’s ethics. One of the central questions about Locke’s moral philosophy is why he never produced a complete system of ethics. In Nuovo’s view, the essentially moral religion of The Reasonableness of Christianity that Locke holds can be found in the gospel of Jesus Christ represents the completion of his ethics. This view has much to recommend it in that Locke thinks the Bible to be an easier and more useful guide to moral conduct than a demonstrative system of ethics expounding the law of nature. Furthermore, God is clearly at the foundation of Locke’s system of ethics. In the fourth of his early Essays on the Law of Nature [1664], Locke argues that a complete moral obligation contains both a terminative aspect and an effective aspect: the terminative aspect refers to the specific practical content of the obligation (i.e., the specific action to be performed or obeyed), and the effective aspect refers to the fact that such content is willed by God. While Locke’s moral philosophy has evolved by the time of his mature work — notably with the adoption of a hedonistic view of human psychology — his basic moral framework remains the same in holding the voluntaristic view that an act of legislation through the divine will is required for there to be a moral obligation (Essay II.xxviii.5,8; ‘Of Ethic in General’, §4). This comports with the description of Christ as legislator in The Reasonableness and his view that pre-Christian ethics was incomplete in being merely definitional (‘Of Ethic in General’, §11). Nevertheless, Locke maintains that ethics can be made into a demonstrative science; the revelation of Christ in the scriptures, however, falls short of demonstrative knowledge in Locke’s estimate. While it is worthwhile to draw together the Essay and The Reasonableness as Nuovo does, there yet remains an incompleteness in Locke’s moral philosophy in his failing to provide a demonstrative system of ethics.

Nuovo sets Locke’s ethics within the tradition of modern natural law beginning with Grotius; in Nuovo’s view, what sets modern natural law theory apart from its Scholastic predecessor is its combination of empirical naturalism with theism (188). Where modernizing occurs in the development of moral philosophy is a question much discussed in the history of philosophy. Elizabeth Anscombe, for instance, argues that modern moral philosophy preserves legislative language in ethics while simultaneously rejecting the idea of a divine legislator. In this sense, Locke’s moral philosophy would be pre-modern in its theism. But for Henry Sidgwick, Locke’s moral philosophy would be modern in being jural, or law-based, rather than eudaimonistic, or virtue-based — it is interesting, for instance, that Locke conceives of virtue as obedience to law. While what makes ethics modern can be understood in different ways, it is worthwhile to draw out both continuities and discontinuities in the history of moral philosophy. Nuovo emphasizes that, in Locke’s view, the content of the divinely-ordained natural law should be accessible to experience and reason. Locke’s moral epistemology represents a divergence from the prominent prior position that moral reasoning occurs through practical syllogisms with the major premises supplied as principles known innately.

To be capable of being under the moral law of nature, human beings require both freedom and reason. Nuovo devotes a significant portion of his chapter on Locke’s ethics to a good discussion of the metaphysics of moral agency underlying human freedom. A complete treatment, however, would also involve a discussion of how reason and sense can come to a knowledge of the content of the natural law. As the Christian virtuoso (at least in Boyle’s sense) should be attuned to teleology in nature, it would make sense to extend this attunement to a moral epistemology that discovers divinely-ordained ends for human beings through the use of experimental reason. A serious problem with Locke’s moral epistemology, though, is that his characterization of moral ideas as mixed modes produced by the mind makes it difficult to see how moral principles could be both certain in being demonstrative and instructive in furnishing us with real knowledge about things external to us.3 It is perhaps these difficulties that leads Nuovo to talk about the content of morality primarily within the context of revelation in The Reasonableness.

Nuovo’s discussion of Locke’s theology in the final chapter is excellent and should be required reading for any scholar interested in the theological and religious dimensions of Locke’s thought. Nuovo makes a compelling case for seeing a methodological parallel between natural history in experimental natural philosophy and historical criticism in Biblical exegesis. He is right to emphasize the importance of Locke in the history of Biblical criticism, and his case shows that more work needs to be done in exploring the relationship between Biblical hermeneutics and the natural history of the virtuosi in and around the Royal Society.

In Nuovo’s view, Locke should be seen as a serious Christian committed to exploring the Bible according to the historical-critical method to get at the original and genuine meaning of the texts of scripture. Furthermore, Locke’s theology is essentially practical in developing a view of Christianity as a primarily moral religion with an account of justification at its core that consists of two essential elements: a belief in the proposition that Jesus is the messiah and a commitment to observing the moral law. Nuovo thinks that the question of whether Locke’s theology is heterodox — for instance, if Locke is properly characterized as an Arminian or Socinian — is overly discussed. I think Nuovo is right here, especially since Locke’s theological commitments in this area are ambiguous. To give an example, Locke wrote ‘Rom X:9’ beside the robustly Trinitarian Athanasian creed — which he evidently takes to mean that confessing that Jesus is Lord is sufficient for justification; yet it is inconclusive whether Locke is denying Trinitarianism or simply denying that belief in it is required for justification. Instead of speculating about ambiguous and unknown commitments, Nuovo focuses on the positive and explicit dimensions of Locke’s theology.

Nuovo summarizes Locke’s biblical theological hermeneutics as consisting of two parts: first, a presupposition of the integrity of texts; and second, a presupposition of the integrity of the whole of biblical revelation, treating texts as a part of a more broadly consistent canon (235). One could say something similar of his interpretive treatment of Locke’s works. In the end, what makes Nuovo’s book an excellent read is seeing how theological themes animate Locke’s works in a way that illuminates the meaning and nature of the texts themselves, but that also demonstrates how these texts are continuous with one another within the broader framework of Locke’s intellectual pursuits as a Christian virtuoso. Nuovo’s book is essential reading for Locke scholars and highly recommended for those interested in the relationship between science and religion in the history of philosophy.

1 For the contrast between speculative and experimental natural philosophy, see Peter Anstey, ‘Experimental Versus Speculative Natural Philosophy’ in The Science of Nature in the Seventeenth Century: Patterns of Changes in Early Modern Natural Philosophy, edited by P. Anstey and J. Schuster, Springer, 2005: 215-242.

2 Elliot Rossiter, ‘Locke, Providence, and the Limits of Natural Philosophy’, British Journal for the History of Philosophy 22.2 (2014): 217-235. See also Essay IV.xiv.2.

3 For a broader examination of this problem, see Emily Carson, ‘Locke’s Account of Certain and Instructive Knowledge’, British Journal for the History of Philosophy (2002) 10.3: 359-378.