John Locke's Political Philosophy and the Hebrew Bible

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Yechiel J. M. Leiter, John Locke's Political Philosophy and the Hebrew Bible, Cambridge University Press, 420pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108428187. 

Reviewed by Victor Nuovo, Harris Manchester College, Oxford/Middlebury College


The thesis of this book is that John Locke was a political Hebraist. Political Hebraism is a school of historical interpretation of recent origin whose purpose is to establish "a new theoretical course for understanding classical political ideas". It proposes nothing new in method, which is to recover the original meaning of these ideas by a historical-critical interpretation of the mostly modern texts in which they were first presented. What is new is the claim that the Hebrew Bible was regarded by the authors of these texts, who were major 17th-century European political thinkers, as a primary source of their ideas, which is to say, they were Political Hebraists.

This book is a product of this school of interpretation. The author, Yechiel Leiter, is a scholar, an academic, and a sometime public official. He was chief-of-staff to Benjamin Netanyahu and is currently senior policy analyst at the Jerusalem Center for Public Affairs. He contends that the major concepts of modern political thought: equality, inalienable rights of life, liberty, and property, government by popular consent, the rule of law, and the right to revolution, which are asserted by Locke in the Two Treatises of Government, were derived by him first and foremost from the Hebrew Scriptures. He believes that previous scholarship has ignored this fact, supposing that these ideas were derived mainly from classical Greek and Roman sources and from experience and reason. He considers Jeremy Waldron's God, Locke and Equality: Christian Foundations of Locke's Political Thought as a partial exception and takes as his point of departure Waldron's observation of the paucity of references to the New Testament in Two Treatises, whereas the Old Testament is cited copiously. Waldron admits being puzzled by this fact, yet he nonetheless concluded that Locke's political theory rested firmly on Christian theism. Leiter claims that he has resolved the puzzle "by arguing in favor of a Hebraic reading of Locke's classical political text". He notes that Locke cited the Old Testament copiously, ignoring the new, and claims this as evidence that he was operating according to Hebraic political principles. Leiter claims that his argument supporting this claim is not only new but also conclusive and, finally, definitive. It represents "a new school of thought in Lockean political interpretation", which should replace all that went before, for it has brought to light the "true conceptual orientation" of Two Treatises.

Leiter develops his argument in six chapters. The first five treat central themes of Two Treatises: natural law, liberty and equality, property, the right of revolution; the final chapter explores Locke's opinion concerning the Fall and human depravity. These chapters are preceded by an introduction, which provides a useful preview of the entire book, chapter by chapter. A conclusion follows in which Leiter sums up his case and restates his thesis.

A reminder: Two Treatises of Government is a work in two parts: the first, which is mainly polemical, consists of a refutation of political absolutism; the second, which is constructive, is an account of "the True Original, Extent, and End of Civil Government".

Chapter 1 opens with a survey of recent scholarship and of the use of the Bible in 17th century political thought; this provides context for an interpretation of Two Treatises. The rest of the chapter deals with its announced theme, the First Treatise. In executing this task, Leiter takes what has become a well-used short cut. Instead of offering a close reading and detailed exposition of the First Treatise, he accelerates the process by helping himself to Locke's summary of it in Ch. 1, §1 of the Second Treatise. He then focuses on the last and longest chapter of the First Treatise, where after having shown that Robert Filmer's claims that Adam had not received by natural right or divine gift dominion over his children or over the world, that even if he had, "his heirs had no right to it", that even if they did, there is "no law of nature nor positive law of God that determines which is the right heir". Locke asks, Who is Adam's rightful heir? It is a decisive question, for without an answer, Filmer's theory of government would have no practical use (First Treatise, Ch. 1 §3). Locke's conclusion is that the question can't be answered and adds that even if it could, it isn't needed, because God never intended the political supremacy of Adam and his descendants. The proof of this lies in the biblical narrative. Locke's refutation of Filmer's case for absolutism is based on the biblical text, because Filmer's justification of patriarchal power depended primarily upon it.

Before proceeding further, I should interject a critical observation. It seems that Leiter has misarranged the order of Locke's central themes and as a consequence misconstrued the sequence of Locke's argument. Had he been more attentive to the argument of the First Treatise, he would have begun his exposition with liberty and equality, for they are the properties of mankind in a state of nature, without which the law of nature would be pointless. This point is made emphatically in the First Treatise. In this light, in the First Treatise, Locke is doing the work of an under-laborer, "removing some of the Rubbish, that lies in the way to knowledge" (Essay, Epistle to the Reader). What he achieved there is summed up in the Second Treatise, Ch. 1, §1 which opens the way for the triumphal entry of the themes of perfect freedom and perfect equality, in Ch. 2, §4. The law of nature follows closely upon this. Thus, in Ch. 2, §6, he declares:

For Men being all the Workmanship of one Omnipotent, and infinitely wise Maker; All the servants of one Sovereign Master, sent into the World by his order about his business . . . And being furnished with like Faculties, sharing all in one Community of Nature, there cannot be supposed any such Subordination among us.

This is mankind in a state of nature, "which has a law of Nature to govern it", of which law, every man has a duty to obey and a right to enforce. Here Locke's claims are based on experience and reason, not Scripture. But the notion of every man, "Sent into the world" to do God's business, may be tacitly Christological. Jesus Christ was also sent into the world by God to restore the law, so that in this respect, everyman is a token of Christ, who is the archetype. Thus, a central theme of Locke's theory of government may be theological in its roots, and Christian, yet arguably, also Hebraic. I have argued elsewhere that Locke's Christology is Messianic.[1] The high Christology of Nicaea and Chalcedon meant little or nothing to him; rather his preferred Christology envisioned Jesus as a king and supreme legislator, who proclaimed a new and more lenient dispensation of the eternal law of nature; also, as Second Adam, he is the supreme archetype or model for mankind. Thus, Locke's politics are better described as infused with a political theology, which is grounded in Messianism, which is a biblical notion. In this respect, he might be described as a Christian Hebraist, or less fancifully, as a biblical theologian.

With regard to the law of nature, Leiter's characterization of Locke's conception of the law of nature as "unusual" may be warranted, for whereas Locke subscribed to the opinion that the law of nature is a discovery of right reason, this discovery depends on a prior discovery that all men are "the Workmanship of one Omnipotent, and infinitely wise Maker", and that all their duties to themselves and others proceeds from that knowledge (Second Treatise, Ch. 2, §6). In other words, the law of nature is a divine law. In Toleration, Locke clarifies the necessity of this recognition, for it is the ground of all obligation: hence "the taking away of God, even only in thought, dissolves all" promises, covenants, and oaths, on which "the bonds of human society" depend; hence, atheists should not be tolerated. In short, the efficacy and understanding of the law of nature depends upon a strict adherence to monotheism, and in declaring this thesis, Locke echoes the strident tones of the harshest of the Hebrew prophets. Finally, because right reason is an endowment of everyman, everyman has the right in a state of nature to execute this law strictly and mercilessly (Second Treatise, Ch. 2, §11; Leiter, 124, 164). All these may be termed instances of Locke's Hebraism.

At the outset of the third chapter, Leiter adds further proof of his thesis of Locke's Hebraism from a remark in Ch. 1, §2 of the First Treatise. Here the theme is government by consent. Locke complains that Filmer intended his "short model", i.e., his argument for absolutism, to become "the Pattern of the Mount" or the "perfect Standard of Politics for the future". The expression he uses is taken from Hebrews 8:5: "See that thou make all things according to the pattern shewed thee in the mount", which in turn is an allusion to Exodus 26, where God instructs Moses about the "pattern" or design of the tabernacle. In Locke's case the reference is to a heavenly tabernacle. Leiter finds that this turning from the New to the Old Testament is significant, for to his mind, it signals, as it were, a turning back or reversal. "It is this 'Pattern in the Mount' that serves as well as the pattern for the construction of his theory of consensual government", by looking back to the polity of Moses as the archetype for a modern theory of government. This is a fanciful connection of words and ideas, but it is hardly sound interpretation.

In establishing equality, Leiter places great importance on Locke's interpretation of Genesis 1:28, the so-called "donation to Adam" of dominion "over the fish of the sea, and fowl of the air, and over every living thing that moveth on the earth". Filmer interpreted this to apply to Adam as king and to his heirs, whereas Locke contends that it refers to Adam as representative of the human species (Leiter, 171-73; 210-11). He regards this as grounding the political idea of equality. But the grounding is not sufficient, for human equality depends upon a prior notion of a common origin (divine creation), and also on a common nature, in particular, rationality, a capacity to make judgments and follow a rule. It may be that these notions are assumed in Scriptures, but they are not clarified or asserted there, which would be necessary for a proper source.

A similar mode of argument follows in Chapter 4, concerning Locke's notion of property and charity and its Hebraic roots. The two notions are connected in the Golden Rule, for the root of the idea of property is self-possession, or self-love, and the commandment is to love others as we love ourselves. Thus, the duty to preserve oneself is joined to the duty to "preserve the rest of Mankind" (Second Treatise, Ch II, §7; Leiter, 209 and Ch. 4 passim). It is memorialized for Christians in Jesus' summary of the law. But the source of Jesus is the Old Testament (Deuteronomy 6:6 and Leviticus 19:18). Leiter's claim has merit, but to root them in the biblical injunctions requires reading content into them that must come from elsewhere, from reason and experience.

Chapter 5 deals with the idea of rebellion. Leiter makes much of Locke's use of the notion of an appeal to heaven, and his reference to Jephthah (Judges 11: 21; Second Treatise, Ch. 3, §21). Locke's point is that when there is no judge on earth to decide on a dispute, then God must judge, which is to say, one goes to war and trusts to a general providence that the outcome will be just. Is this a Hebraic idea? Again, the biblical narrative is made a setting for reflection, but it hardly supplies the ideas that one is seeking.

Chapter 6 deals with Locke's heterodox opinion concerning original sin. Its focus is on Locke's rejection of Augustinian or Calvinist doctrine of original sin and human depravity. Locke's case against this doctrine is presented in The Reasonableness of Christianity, and, Leiter is correct, the argument presented there centers on the biblical narrative of Adam's disobedience given in Genesis. The argument is exegetical, based on the plain sense of God's warning to Adam that if he disobeyed God's commandment not to eat of the fruit of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil, he would die, which is to say, he and his progeny would become mortal. It may be true that Locke's interpretation of this narrative was in conformity with "the classical Hebraic reading of the Biblical text", but there is no evidence that this was intentional rather than coincidental, or that Locke derived his belief that man is a free responsible agent from that source. Indeed, in developing his views on free moral agency, Locke was following reason while focusing on no particular source (for a philosophical account of Locke's moral thinking see Antonia LoLordo, Locke's Moral Man, Oxford University Press, 2012, 25-26, and passim).

Overall, this is a very readable book, providing useful summaries of historical context and of recent scholarship. But it is marred by dubious claims such as the Hebrew origin of major philosophical concepts, among them the notion of tabula rasa and Plato's theory of recollection, and by specious arguments in favor of them (Leiter, 219; see also 89, 122, 210).

On one issue Leiter is on very solid ground. The Old Testament is a political document. This, of course, is not a new discovery. Spinoza made it three and one-half centuries ago. The theme of this document is the political fortune of a state that no longer exists: the ancient state of Israel, which it was promised will be restored by God at some future time. Locke shared this hope, but as a Christian, he believed that the promised restoration had already begun under the leadership of Jesus the Messiah, and that what is to be restored is a kingdom not of this world. He supposed that this gave Christians the right to appropriate the Jewish Scriptures and all of its promises; that God warranted it, and, in 70 AD God took vengeance on the ancient state of Israel, because their people did not acknowledge the Messiah when he appeared (Reasonableness, 67, 70, 95). This is a harsh and morally repugnant opinion. Political Hebraism is a reasonable reaction to this sort of Christian thinking, as is the endeavor of Political Hebraists to take back their heritage, which from their standpoint was misappropriated by Christianity. This endeavor deserves universal respect. But as principles of a school of historical interpretation, as pure disinterested scholarship, these claims are unsubstantial and rest on the quicksand of sophistry.

[1] "Locke's Christology as a Key to Understanding His Philosophy", in Victor Nuovo, Christianity, Antiquity, and Enlightenment (Dordrecht: Springer, 2011), 75-101.