John R. Searle: Thinking about the Real World

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Dirk Franken, Attila Karakus, and Jan G. Michel (eds.), John R. Searle: Thinking about the Real World, Ontos, 2010, 236pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9783868380965.

Reviewed by Joshua Rust, Stetson University


John R. Searle: Thinking about the Real World includes a series of critical responses to Searle's broad ranging corpus on the occasion of the thirteenth annual Münster Lectures on Philosophy. The Lectures have the laudable aim of facilitating conversation between some of the world's best philosophers and students of the Münster Philosophy Department. The book also contains Searle's responses to the eleven essays along with his introduction to the entirety of his work. Searle's introduction contains material on ethics and aesthetics that has not been discussed elsewhere.

The critical essays themselves concern diverse topics and are of varying quality; the range of topics discussed makes it impossible for a review of this size to address more than a few of the themes brought up. But as one surveys each of Searle's replies one cannot help but be struck by certain formal similarities. In many cases Searle charges the authors with misunderstanding his views. Indeed, at one point he testily complains that "Often people misunderstand the answers I give to my questions, but these authors have not understood the questions" (230). Of course, if Searle is feeling misunderstood, he is not unique in this regard. Philosophy is difficult; we become accustomed to the anxiety that comes from misunderstanding an author (when reading, e.g., Kant) as well as the anxiety that comes from being misunderstood.

One reading of Austin's How to Do Things with Words (1962) understands Searle's teacher as providing a taxonomy of the different ways in which we might request clarification in response to a misunderstanding -- different ways of understanding the question, "What did you say?" Such a question might be prompted by a confusion, e.g., as to the illocutionary force of an utterance, as to the referent of the words used, or even as to which noises were actually uttered.

However, it is worth reflecting on how expressions (and accusations) of philosophical perplexity measure against the kind of clarificatory hurdles which are the object of Austin's investigation -- the kind of misunderstandings we run up against in day-to-day, non-philosophical contexts. It is not uncommon for a hearer to fail to understand what one's words mean ("By 'you' I was referring to all of you … ") or fail to understand the force with which they were said ("… and that's an order!"). And occasionally these are the sort of confusions Searle addresses. For example, in "Problems with Searle's Account of Intrinsic Intentionality," the criticism of Searle's account of intrinsic intentionality rests on the authors' assumption that "intrinsic" means non-relational when in fact, as Searle points out in his reply, he used the word "intrinsic" to mean non-reducible (205).

But most of Searle's accusations of misunderstanding cannot be so neatly brought under the Austinian taxonomy. This is especially evident in his philosophy of mind.

Searle divides the world into, first, the ontologically objective and ontologically subjective and, second, the observer independent and the observer relative. Basic physical facts such as mountains and molecules are both ontologically objective and observer independent. Social and institutional facts, including linguistic facts, are both ontologically subjective and observer dependent. Words and money exist by virtue of us. But mental facts alone are ontologically subjective (intrinsic) but observer independent. Mental facts are not ontologically objective brute facts but neither are they among the observer dependent derived facts. This relative autonomy has caused Searle's interlocutors considerable difficulty. For example, the authors of "Searle's Biological Naturalism: A Typology" challenge Searle to explain why he isn't a property dualist, since he includes within his foundational ontology "an entity borrowed from ordinary common sense ontology, i.e., consciousness" (77).

Searle believes that the authors of this paper "seriously misunderstand my views" (210) and reiterates that while mental facts are ontologically subjective, they are otherwise entirely physical: "The reason I claim Biological Naturalism is not a form of Property Dualism is that Biological Naturalism denies that consciousness is a separate ontological realm" (214). It's nevertheless easy to sympathize with these authors' attempt to pin down Searle's account of consciousness.

There's a difference in Searle's attempt to clarify his use of "intrinsic" and his attempt to clarify Biological Naturalism, and I want to suggest the latter differs from Austinian clarification in a way that goes beyond mere scope (a particular word vs. a whole theory). One indication of this difference is that Searle struggles to paraphrase Biological Naturalism in ways that radically depart from the phrasing as found in his primary texts. But even more tellingly Searle himself appears to think that his attempts at elaboration probably can't help:

Why is not biological naturalism obviously true to anybody who thinks about the question and knows even a little about how the world works? The answer is, in large part, historical. We are still in thrall to the confused [dualistic] categories we have inherited (214).

When Searle says that we are still in thrall to the traditional categories, either the "we" here includes Searle, in which case he himself may not know exactly what he means or, perhaps more disturbingly, it doesn't and his reminders as to the limitations of the traditional categories serve only to remind us that he sees something that we, despite repeated clarifications, cannot. This disquietude is heightened when Searle says, over the course of two sentences, that Biological Naturalism is simultaneously "obviously true" and, yet, elusive due to our intellectual inheritance. Searle's clarifying his use of the term "intrinsic" differs from his attempt at clarifying Biological Naturalism in that the latter appears to require epiphany. I wish to claim that if the speaker doesn't understand what he or she is saying, or else is in principle unable to effect the required comprehension in the hearer (because of our inheritance), then there is a gap between ordinary Austinian misunderstanding and the kind of confusion Searle charges his interlocutors with having. This is just to say that if something has gone wrong, it's not clear that Searle's interlocutors have merely failed to understand him.

This pattern of response reasserts itself in the discussion of mental causation. As we have seen, Searle's observer independent foundational ontology can be subdivided into the ontologically subjective and ontologically objective. A traditional question, then, concerns how the one can causally affect the other. How can my intention to move my hand cause my hand to move? The authors of "Searle on Mental Causation" worry that Biological Naturalism cannot overcome Jaegwon Kim's causal exclusion problem, wherein Searle is forced to understand mental causation in terms of one of three alternatives, each of which Searle finds unsatisfactory. Either mental and physical facts causally overdetermine a given behavioral effect, the mental facts are epiphenomenal and causally inert, or the mental facts are reduced or eliminated in favor of physical facts. Because Searle takes mental causation seriously the second and third alternatives are non-starters. He also rejects the possibility of causal overdetermination (or, a fourth alternative, immanent causation). So how to account for mental causation? Searle's reply is characteristic insofar as he goes on to affirm elusively both horns of the dilemma while suggesting that the dilemma is a fiction imposed on us by traditional ways of thinking. The mental characterization is simply a higher-order description of those neurobiological processes, but that higher-order description must somehow include an appeal to the irreducibility of consciousness.

There is, of course, a middle ground between ordinary Austinian misunderstanding and the kind of mental consternation Searle tends to provoke with his theory of consciousness and mental causation. Sometimes misunderstanding provides an occasion for both the hearer and the speaker to further their dialogical aims. Searle uses some authors' confusions about the relation of ethics and institutional reality, not only to abate those confusions, but to elaborate on the place of ethics and aesthetics within his social ontology.

Institutional facts, for Searle, already imply deontological commitments. The institutional status-function of a professor entails desire-independent reasons to grade, publish, etc. However, the authors of both "More than Words Can Say: Searle on the Constitution of Social Facts" and "The Role of Declarations in the Construction of Social Reality" wish to deny (or simply do not understand) this implication. They think that Searle's theory of institutionality requires "extra-linguistic elements that generate normativity" (195) or some "special authority" (170) which would further explain why professors have the commitments they do:

Some say that a commitment, for instance, originates from (1) the purely personal motivation not to be subject to social pressure or from (2) the assumption that the following of rules leads to a peaceful living together, or even from (3) the knowledge that one's own interests could be contrary to the rules (195).

Something else -- such as an ethical code or enlightened self-interest -- is needed to explain institutional norms, "like in a monarchy where political institution emanates by the grace of god" (196).

Searle doesn't mention that this challenge echoes the dialectical space of his early paper "How to Derive 'Ought' From 'Is'" (1964). He argued there against those who thought that promising required additional moral principles which would bridge the gap between mere utterance of a promise and the ensuing obligations. Searle argued that promises are already obligations, so there is nothing to explain (and so there is no gap between "is" and "ought"). The ensuing obligations are not accidental features of promise-making. And in that early paper he generalized the point about promising to institutional facts: to be a professor is already to have certain commitments. Searle simply rejects the authors' demand for explanation (in the same way that we would reject someone's demand to explain why bachelors are unmarried).

But these authors' confusion proves particularly useful: if our moral principles do not explain the desire-independent reasons for action entailed by a status-function, where does the ethical fit into Searle's overall account of institutional reality? Searle briefly addresses this question for the first time in the introductory essay, "The Basic Reality and the Human Reality". Ethical codes "are natural derivations from the account of human life and society that I have been giving" (40), rather than the other way around. In particular, Searle argues that while ethics may have some evolutionary-genetic bases, it is principally a human practice that shares the same formal features that institutional practices have: it requires language, concerns desire-independent reasons for action, and is universal in the sense that I can't recognize you as having an obligation toward me without also recognizing the converse.

Searle's essay also contains some brief remarks about aesthetics. Broadly speaking he adopts a Humean account wherein aesthetic properties are ones which prompt aesthetic evaluations as underlain by pleasant and unpleasant experiences. These experiences are, moreover, pervasive in the sense that every conscious experience has an aesthetic dimension. Searle claims that negative aesthetic evaluations, unlike ethical evaluations, do not require the evaluator to specify what should have been done instead. Searle then distinguishes aesthetics and art. Where aesthetics is a pervasive phenomenological attribute, art is a culturally contingent institutional fact.

Readers interested in Searle's take on ethics and aesthetics will, no doubt, remain unsatisfied. He gives the reader a list of some formal properties of each domain without saying much about how those domains fit into his larger enterprise. For example, given the symmetry between the formal features of ethics and institutional status-functions, one can't help but wonder why Searle insists that the ethical doesn't completely "overlap" the institutional, beyond the blanket appeal to matters of "grave importance." With respect to aesthetics, while we've been told that aesthetic evaluations are pervasive, Searle's readers might like to know whether or not those evaluations require language and, if so, whether such judgments are epistemically objective or epistemically subjective. And if our interest in art, unlike aesthetics, is largely disinterested, does that imply that aesthetic experience could -- as Nehamas (2010) has recently suggested -- be among our reasons to act?


Austin, J. L. (1962). How to Do Things with Words. The William James lectures; 1955. Harvard University Press.

Nehamas, A. (2010). Only a Promise of Happiness: The Place of Beauty in a World of Art. Princeton University Press.

Searle, J. R. (1964). "How to Derive 'Ought' From 'Is'." The Philosophical Review 73 (1): 43-58.