John Rawls: Reticent Socialist

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William A. Edmundson, John Rawls: Reticent Socialist, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 212pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316625774.

Reviewed by Paul Weithman, University of Notre Dame


The financial crisis of 2008 and its aftermath shook many people's faith in neoliberalism -- understood as a regime that combines a competitive economy, expressive and associational liberty, and representative democracy with low taxes, the free movement of capital, labor and goods, and a minimal social safety net. The most pressing political question of our time is what will govern us next.

There are, of course, the radical alternatives. The leader plenipotentiary of China has reaffirmed his commitments to "socialism with Chinese characteristics"[1] and to the Communist Party's guidance "over all tasks".[2] In the west, large numbers have turned toward populism and nationalism. These alternatives are radical in being illiberal: they invite faith in strong leaders who promise their followers decent lives, but at the cost of liberties for some or all. And so if our most pressing political question is what will govern us if neoliberalism does not, a pressing question for political philosophy is whether it can present options which are liberal but which avoid the failures of neoliberalism that give the radical alternatives their specious allure. John Rawls was deeply troubled by what happens when a people loses faith in liberal democracy; he wrote that the task of political philosophy is to show that such a faith is reasonable.[3] His work therefore seems ideally suited to provide an answer.

As William Edmundson reminds us in this welcome book, Rawls's Theory of Justice is often read as a defense of welfare-state capitalism. (p. 3) Welfare-state capitalism is, roughly, the more generous and egalitarian form of liberal capitalism that began in the US with the New Deal and that held sway here until the 1980's. Thus the possibility in which Rawls seemed to invite his readers to place their faith was that of realizing an even more just liberal society of that familiar kind.

But if this interpretation of Rawls were correct, his work would not accomplish the task he set himself or provide viable answers to the questions that press us, for his "realistic utopia" would not be the stably just society he promised.[4] That is because the relative egalitarianism that welfare-state capitalism offers is a vulnerable achievement. Its vulnerability is confirmed by the fact that in the US, welfare-state capitalism morphed into neoliberalism when growth slowed, markets globalized and the party of the New Deal and the Great Society tacked toward the center. Its vulnerability is explained, in part, by the fact that welfare-state capitalism allows for the concentration of capital in a few private hands. As Thomas Piketty famously argued, under modest assumptions, the accumulation of privately-held capital generates ever-increasing economic inequality.[5] Since in societies animated by welfare-state capitalism, political equality is nominal and influence goes to the moneyed, it generates great inequalities in political power as well. Those with capital can then undo the legislation that made a generous welfare state possible.

In his late work, Rawls denied that justice as fairness was an apologia for welfare-state capitalism. He also conceded that he had abetted its misinterpretation by failing to distinguish welfare-state capitalism from "property-owning democracy." Rawls's denial, his concession and his claim that his principles could be satisfied only by property-owning democracy or democratic socialism are the x-, y- and z-coordinates of Edmundson's starting point.

The "central thesis" of Edmundson's book is that the question of whether those principles are better satisfied by property-owning democracy or liberal socialism can be "resolve[d] . . . in favor of liberal democratic socialism" -- and resolved by considerations Rawls himself lays out. (p. 10) Though Edmundson thinks Rawls was a socialist, he also thinks Rawls was a "reticent" one. In his penultimate chapter, Edmundson says why he thinks Rawls was not forthcoming about his institutional commitments.

Edmundson makes his case by a careful reading of Rawls's Justice as Fairness: A Restatement.[6] Restatement has not figured prominently in the Rawls literature. One reason Edmundson's book is so valuable is that it makes much of some of the arguments Rawls advanced in it.[7] Among the new arguments found in Restatement, and ones to which Edmundson gives considerable attention, are those in defense of the principles of justice. In Theory, Rawls defended them via a comparison with average utilitarianism. He argued that they would be preferred by parties who were veiled in ignorance and who used the maximin rule. In Restatement, he defends them via two "fundamental comparisons". He again argues that parties following maximin would prefer his principles to average utilitarianism. He then compares his principles to constrained utilitarianism: the principles that result from replacing his difference principle with the principle of average utility constrained by a social minimum. Because the worst outcome of constrained utilitarianism is satisfactory, maximin is out of place. Rawls argues instead that his principles would be preferred on grounds of publicity, reciprocity and stability.

Edmundson shows the power of the arguments advanced in the second comparison by putting them to imaginative use. To see how he uses them, we have to see another of the novelties in Restatement.

There Rawls distinguished "five kinds of regimes":

  • laissez-faire capitalism
  • state socialism with a command economy
  • welfare-state capitalism
  • liberal (democratic) socialism
  • property-owning democracy

Each of these is given by what Rawls calls its "ideal institutional description." (Restatement, p. 137) Such descriptions are conjunctive. One conjunct gives the aims of the system -- the values or states of affairs it is intended to realize. The other is a description of institutions such as those of capital ownership and formation, taxation, industrial management, and mechanisms for determining price and income, which are designed to realize those aims.[8]

Rawls thinks it clear that the first three regime-types cannot realize his principles because, though their ideal institutional descriptions have different first conjuncts, none of them aims at justice as fairness.[9] But he thinks the remaining two can aim at justice as fairness, and so could have the first conjunct of their ideal institutional descriptions in common. They differ in their second conjuncts. Under liberal socialism, "the means of production are owned by society." (ibid., p. 138) In a property-owning democracy, "background institutions . . . work to disperse the ownership of wealth and capital" while allowing for the possibility that they remain in private hands. (ibid., p. 139) Rawls assumed that each regime can realize its aim (ibid., p. 138) and concluded that "we need not decide between [them]."

Though I cannot argue the point here, I believe Rawls's purposes were limited enough that he did not need to decide between them. But the questions of whether both can realize justice as fairness, and whether one would better realize it than the other, remain interesting questions. They also bear on the pressing questions I identified at the outset. For the political and intellectual traction a Rawlsian answer could gain surely depends, in part, upon its implications for property ownership.

Edmundson draws out what he thinks those implications are in his dense, thorough and creative tenth chapter. There he argues that the considerations that would lead parties in the original position to favor justice as fairness over constrained utilitarianism would later lead them to favor liberal socialism over property-owning democracy. And so, he argues, they would "Constitutionally entrench. . . joint ownership of the major means of production." (p. 152) I shall focus on considerations of stability, which Edmundson thinks make his "central thesis . . . evident" (p. 10), but which I think less decisive.

For Rawls, stability is predicated in the first instance of conceptions of justice. When he says that justice as fairness would be stable, what he means can be put by saying that the agreement reached in the original position would be stable because everyone would honor it for reasons of the right kind.[10] A society well-ordered by justice as fairness would then be stably just for the right reasons. And so though Edmundson does not always say this clearly, when he writes that considerations of stability favor liberal socialism, what he must mean is that a liberal socialist regime which aims at justice as fairness would be more stably in conformity with it -- for the right reasons -- than a property-owning democracy which aims at it.[11] Neither liberal socialism nor property-owning democracy allows the concentration of capital in private hands, so neither has the built-in source of instability that I said plagues welfare-state capitalism. Why, then, would citizens of a property-owning democracy be more likely to defect from the agreement reached in the original position than those of a liberal socialist regime?

As I understand Edmundson's answer, it depends upon the clarity with which liberal socialist regimes can be seen to satisfy the demands of justice. That clarity depends upon Edmundson's claims that (i) in a liberal socialist regime, all and only "major means of production" would be socially owned and (ii) the question of what means of production are major in his sense is easily answerable or justiciable. Grant that Edmundson's defenses of (ii) succeed. (pp. 142-43 and 152-53) What of (i)?

Edmundson says "major means of production" are "those that everyone . . . must have access to because they depend on them for leading a full, if ordinary productive life." (p. 150) On first reading, the definition of 'major means of production' in terms of a productive life suggests an argument for (i). Take society to be a scheme of social cooperation, understood as a scheme for cooperative economic production. Take one of the ends of justice to be that of giving each member of the scheme a fair chance to lead "a full . . . productive life," understood as a life in which she contributes fully to society's economic product. What justice demands to realize that end is that everyone have fair access to the essential inputs of production. Social ownership of the organizations that provide the inputs meets that demand, and so in a liberal socialist regime those organizations would be socially owned.[12] It would leave access to assets which are not essential for a productive life to pure procedural justice. (p. 151)

This argument is not quite Edmundson's, for he does not think all the major means of production furnish inputs to productive processes. One of his examples of a major means of production is the insurance industry. (p. 150) Insurance companies are in the business of assuming risk, and so provide a condition of, rather than an input to, production. And so Edmundson's definition of 'major means' should be interpreted more capaciously.

But now consider Microsoft, Apple, Amazon, Alphabet, Facebook and Walmart. As of December 31, 2018, the first five were among the world's six largest publicly traded companies by market capitalization.[13] The last has 1.4 million US employees.[14] Ownership of them is concentrated enough that those most prominently associated with them are fabulously wealthy. A property-owning democracy would surely insure that ownership in them was dispersed. But even if we interpret 'major means of production' capaciously enough to accommodate all of Edmundson's examples, it is hard to see that these six corporations qualify as major means, as Edmundson concedes when speaking of some of them. (p. 42 note 9) If they do not, then his version of liberal socialism would leave ownership of them to the market. This seems an undesirable implication, given Edmundson's concern with the political liberties, and the outsize ability that those with large stakes in these corporations have to affect the political agenda and the work lives of large numbers of people.

Why adopt so restrictive a characterization of the major means of production? The argument for (i) turned on the claim that one of the ends of justice is that of giving everyone a fair chance to lead an economically productive life. Major means of production were then identified by asking which enterprises furnish the essential means to such a life. It is because Edmundson thinks that question can be answered easily that he assumes (ii), characterizes "major means" narrowly and ultimately concludes that, according to Rawls, those means and only those means must be socially owned.

But while Rawls would acknowledge the importance of exercising our productive capacities broadly understood, he would add that for purposes of theorizing about justice, human life should be conceived primarily as the ongoing pursuit of a conception of the good. What justice ultimately demands, on Rawls's view, is that all have a fair chance freely to live lives so conceived. That is why he says that "the end of social justice" -- by which I take him to mean "the ultimate end of social justice" to which other ends of justice are ordered -- is "to maximize the worth to the least advantaged of the complete scheme of equal liberty shared by all."[15]

Rawls recognizes that differences in wealth make for differences in the worth of liberty.[16] But there is no indication that he thinks the only differences that make for them are differences in ownership of what Edmundson regards as major means of production. Moreover, it seems possible that pursuit of the Rawlsian "end of social justice" can be frustrated by concentrations of ownership even in enterprises which do not qualify as major by Edmundson's lights. If so, then liberal socialism will enjoy the advantage of clarity over property-owning democracy only if it possible to re-draw the distinction which was essential to Edmundson's defense of it -- now a clear, ex ante distinction between those enterprises which can frustrate the Rawlsian end of social justice, and which should therefore be socially owned, and those whose ownership can be left to pure procedural justice. If that distinction cannot be drawn, then liberal socialism will not enjoy the advantage of clarity that Edmundson claims for it.

This worry does not detract from my wholehearted endorsement of Edmundson's interesting, carefully argued and thoroughly researched book. Reticent Socialist demonstrates the interest of a work of Rawls's that has been unduly neglected. It will be an invaluable resource for all who are interested in the merits of property-owning democracy and liberal socialism, or who are concerned with the property arrangements of an ideally just society.

But as Edmundson's last chapter makes clear, he does not just want to close an open question in Rawlsian ideal theory. His book therefore takes us back to the question of whether Rawlsianism can provide a viable alternative to neoliberalism in our current circumstances. The popularity of self-described socialist candidates, and the fact that more millennials have a favorable opinion of socialism than capitalism,[17] might be thought to ground reasonable faith in the socialist Rawlsianism Edmundson defends. But what a plurality of Americans mean by 'socialism' is not a regime in which major means of production are socially owned. It is a capitalist economy that yields more equal outcomes than ours currently does.[18] Property-owning democracy is not even popularly discussed. It therefore seems that the best we can realistically expect, for now, is not Rawlsianism but a somewhat more generous form of welfare-state capitalism. Let's hope we get it.


[1] Xi Jinping, "Uphold and Develop Socialism with Chinese Characteristics", The Governance of China (Shanghai: Shanghai Press, 2015) vol. 1, pp. 23-26.

[2] Chris Buckley and Steven Lee Myers, "China's Leadership Says Party Must Control 'All Tasks' and Asian Markets Slump". The New York Times, December 18, 2019. (emphasis added)  (accessed January 10, 2019).

[3] John Rawls, Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1996), pp. lxi-lxii.

[4] The phrase "realistic utopia" is from John Rawls, The Law of Peoples (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2001), p. 6.

[5] Thomas Piketty, CAPITAL in the Twenty-First Century (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2015). For the reading of Piketty according to which inequality is ever-increasing, see Lawrence Summers, "The Inequality Puzzle", Democracy 33 (Summer 2014) (accessed January 18, 2019).

[6] John Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Restatement (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2001) ed. Kelly.

[7] Even those familiar with Rawls's works will benefit from Edmundson's discussion of them. To give an example I cannot pursue: Edmundson's treatment of the role the "special psychologies" play in Restatement made me reconsider the role I had long thought they played in Theory. (See Reticent Socialist, chapter 7.)

[8] This paragraph is drawn from my review of Martin O'Neill and Thad Williamson (eds.), Property-Owning Democracy: Rawls and Beyond (Wiley-Blackwell, 2012), where I discuss Rawls's method in the relevant section of Restatement in some detail. The review was posted on Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews on August 20, 2013 (accessed January 13, 2019).

[9] Laissez-faire capitalism, like the neoliberalism with which I began, aims instead at "economic efficiency and growth" and maintains too low a social minimum to be just. (Restatement, p. 137) State socialism, which like "socialism with Chinese characteristics" is "supervised by a one-party regime," not only does not aim at "the equal basic rights and liberties" but routinely violates them to maintain one-party rule. (Cf. Restatement, p. 138) Welfare-state capitalism -- as I mentioned when I discussed it earlier -- honors only nominal political equality, allows concentrations of private capital, and so allows control of political and economic life "to rest in a few hands." It therefore does not aim at the fair value of the political liberties that Rawls's first principle requires. (Restatement, pp. 137-38) The social minima provided by welfare states could be generous enough to allow for a decent life. Indeed, though Rawls does not say so, they presumably would be by welfare-states which aimed to satisfy constrained utilitarianism. But even so, welfare-state capitalism does not aim at a value that is crucial to the defense of justice as fairness against constrained utilitarianism: that of reciprocity. (Restatement, p. 138)

[10] Rawls is especially clear about this in "Domain of the Political and Overlapping Consensus," in his Collected Papers (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999) ed. Freeman. See p. 479, note 12 and the accompanying text, and p. 487, note 30.

[11] Thus on p. 116, Edmundson correctly observes that the "institutional contribution" to stability is "a robust tendency [of institutions] to stay just." (emphasis original) But at p. 90, he writes "A well-ordered society is one that 'endures over time,' which entails that it is stabilized by its conception of justice." (emphasis original) This remark suggests that Edmundson thinks the stability of a well-ordered society is something that is brought about over time by justice as fairness, as civic friendship and shared prosperity might be. But in Rawlsian parlance, the stability of a well-ordered society consists in its conformity over time with justice as fairness, not in a consequence of that conformity.

[12] As if to confirm that this is his line of thought, Edmundson asks rhetorically, "If society is a fair system of social cooperation, how can the property that is essential to everyone's productive activity not ultimately be the property of all cooperating members?". (p. 124)

[14] See Walmart … ¼ Million  (accessed January 15, 2019).

[15] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999), p. 179.

[16] Rawls, Theory, p. 179.

[17] Catherine Rampell, "Millenials have a higher opinion of socialism than of capitalism", Washington Post, February 5, 2016 (accessed January 10, 2019).

[18] Frank Newport, "The Meaning of 'Socialism' to Americans Today" (accessed January 10, 2019).