John Searle

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Joshua Rust, John Searle, Continuum, 2009, 174pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826497529.

Reviewed by Nick Fotion, Emory University



John Searle has had a long and productive career. Since the 1960s and now into the twenty-first century, he has published articles and books on such a variety of philosophic topics that the label “the complete philosopher” can be rightly applied to him. Raised in the Oxford school of analytic philosophy, where, typically, philosophers carefully farmed small fields of concepts, it is surprising to see someone like Searle engage in farming on a grand scale.

All the more reason for a book like the one Joshua Rust has written. Rust gives his readers a grand overview of Searle’s many philosophic activities. In doing so¸ he protects those who might have read one or two of Searle’s books and articles from being misled as to what Searle is up to. Rust’s overview is systematic. Rather than following Searle’s thoughts as they developed over time, he discusses Searle’s more general stances and, roughly speaking, moves to the more specific. Understandably, then, Rust’s first chapter is concerned with Searle’s basic ontology.

Searle calls his ontology external realism. Planets, mountains, trees and clouds exist quite apart from our ability to observe them. When we come to observe or know about them, we do so via science. The universe, Searle tells us, is best characterized by science. So Searle calls himself a scientific naturalist. However, he is committed as well to common sense, an ontology that also believes in mountains, trees and clouds. But that ontology is also committed to the reality of subjective mental experiences many of which possess intentionality (i.e., are about things in the world) and can involve intentions (to make decisions).

It is these mental phenomena that pose a problem for Searle. Science is certainly able to account for trees, for example, by talk of subatomic particles and biological processes. But it isn’t at home with subjective talk. Typically those who might call themselves scientific naturalists ignore subjectivity. Or they grant its existence but say that it has no causal role to play in our lives. Searle wants to have nothing to do with such views. Rust does an excellent job of showing how Searle deals with these science/subjectivity problems. Searle, he tells us, treats subjectivity as a biological phenomenon. Humans in particular evolved so that their subjective state became very sophisticated. This state not only exhibits intentionality (as when one sees an object like a ball, hears the whistle, comes to know that it is raining) but also has the ability to understand language. Subjectivity of this kind is not found in robots. Robots can imitate conscious human intelligence but they do not have the biological make up to generate conscious experience as such.

Beyond all that, Searle insists that our ability to act intentionally has also biologically evolved. We are not machines that just respond causally to stimuli. We have evolved so that we can act (autonomously) and not just react. Having such an ability is important for Searle since much of his analysis of language, the work which first made him famous, unavoidably involves intentions.

Searle’s analysis of language begins with the concept of a speech act. As he originally stated it, speech acts represent the minimal units of language communication. Searle distinguishes speech acts from ordinary physical actions such chopping wood since the latter are not communicative acts. Neither are certain language expressions, such as “Damn it!”, communicative acts simply because they are not acts at all. Rather, they are better characterized as events caused by, for example, the accidental dropping of one’s expensive Rolex watch.

Although they are the minimal units of language communication, speech acts are complex entities. Like the mind, they possess aboutness, that is, they have content. Typically, they are about the trees, the mountains and the people found in the world that Searle says is real. They also possess “force.” The force of one speech act may be a prediction (“The tree will fall down soon”) while another may be a promise (“I promise to take down that tree”). Also, again typically, a speech act will have what Searle calls a sincerity condition. Here is where Searle’s precious mental concepts come into play once again. The sincerity condition for my promise is that I intend to do what I say I will. The sincerity condition for my prediction is that I believe the tree will fall. There is more, of course, that could be said about speech acts and their sincerity conditions.

Because there is and because there are so many different kinds of speech acts, Searle (and before him his teacher John Austin) felt compelled to classify speech acts into a few major types. Rust discusses Searle’s classification system but does so in a rather cursory fashion. Unlike what he says about Searle’s views on other matters, Rust does not compare what Searle says here with what others (for example, Austin) have said. Searle divides speech acts into five types: assertive speech acts (descriptions of the present or the past, predictions, hypotheses, guesses), commissives (promises, vows, swearings, pledges), directives (orders, askings, pleadings), expressives (condolences, greetings, well-wishes, congratulations), and declarations (of war, excommunications, firings — as in “You’re fired”, acts of forgiveness). Because his analysis is cursory Rust does not raise the question of whether Searle was right when he said that five is the magic number. Could there be a sixth major speech act type that might be called evaluatives? These would be speech acts that rank individuals, actions and events. “He is the best candidate,” “I had a bad day at the office today,” and “He is a C student” are examples. These evaluative speech acts are different enough from the other five that a plausible case for saying that the magic number for a taxonomy of speech acts is six rather than five.

Rust’s relative lack of interest in the whole corpus of Searle’s work on language also encourages him not to report on what Searle says, for example, about indirect speech acts (where the speaker means what he says but means also more than what he says). At a concert you say to the lady in front of you “Your hat is blocking my view.” This is obviously an assertive. But the unspoken indirect speech act is that the lady should take the hat off, move or do something to unblock the view, so the indirect speech act is a directive. Nor does Rust tell us about Searle’s analysis of fictive uses of language. Searle’s foray into fiction is important because it gives us a clue about the things he would have said about language use on the speech activity (discourse) level had he not moved on, perhaps prematurely, to develop his theory of the mind.

Rust does better when he deals with the questions Searle asks about the construction of social reality. How does social reality get generated from a base of physical objects, events and processes? That is, how do humans generate institutions such as marriage, money, the office of the president, baseball and libraries? The key concept here is what Searle calls a constitutive rule. Such a rule takes the form “X counts as Y in context C.” In effect we humans create institutions by making X, which might be, for example, a ball flying over a fence after it has been hit by a stick, count as a home run. Strictly speaking the formula doesn’t tell us how we came to treat the flying ball as a home run. It mainly speaks to the structure of the convention concerned with a stick, a ball and a fence. The home-run convention could have been adopted explicitly by citing a version of the constitutive rule, but it also could have been adopted gradually by those hitting balls in fenced-in fields.

It is no different when we think, as Searle is prone to, of the institution of money. Pieces of green paper (X) become money (Y) when we decide to make that paper count as money. Rust does an excellent job of discussing the details of this sort construction. He gives a variety of good examples and presents his readers with helpful diagrams. It should be mentioned that there are helpful diagrams scattered through most of the book that cover topics in both philosophy of mind and of language.

One additional concept in Searle’s collection of concepts deserves attention. The Background is in place, for Searle, both to the benefit of the mind and of language. An individual thought is not fully understood on its own. Rather it nests with an almost indefinite number of other thoughts (the Network) but also, and again, among an indefinite number of habits, tendencies, etc. that fall largely beyond our ability to think about them by using language (the Background). As an example of the Background, notice that we respond to the working of gravity by adjusting to its effects when we play tennis. We also expect the yellow tennis ball to stay the same color after we have hit it and further do not expect it to change into a flower when it hits the surface of our clay court.

Rust thinks that the Background-concept makes trouble for Searle. He thinks that Searle has no place for it in his ontology. The trouble, he says, is that since the Background is largely beyond the reach of language it does not belong in the mind which, of course, is where we find intentionality and intentions. But, then, the Background must belong in the body (mostly in the nervous system) where intentionality and intentions have no place. The Background, it seems, then, would also have no place for anything like the normativity found in the mind. In short, Rust claims that Searle is not clear on what the relationship is between the mind and the Background.

Clear or not, given Searle’s general philosophic stance, here is what he should be saying. The Background is, indeed, pre-intentional. Our knowledge, say, of gravity, is not mainly cognitive but expressed in terms of knowing how. We know how to behave in order to take account of gravity’s influence on us. In this sense the Background is nothing more than a composite of our hardwired and non-hardwired reactions. So in one sense there is no normativity in the Background. But since our reactions mimic (always?) normative behavior, normativity is not absent. We can see this by considering an example from tennis once again. A student of the game is told to lay back his wrist as he hits the tennis ball. While taking tennis lessons, his instructor cites the rule about the wrist repeatedly. In time, the student comes to know how to hit the ball correctly without thinking about it. At this point the student no longer needs to follow the rule. However, this doesn’t mean that the rule has been internalized, so that it is cited unconsciously. Rather the muscles and the nervous system have taken over in such a way that they are acting in accordance with the rule. Normativity, if that implies choice, is strictly speaking not present, yet it is represented in the way the student’s body mimics the rule about laying back one’s wrist. So, the body is reacting correctly even if it is not deciding to do so. Thus, contrary to what Rust suggests, I am suggesting that Searle has no problem with the concept of the Background. His ontology can deal with it without too much trouble.