John Stuart Mill: A Biography

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Capaldi, Nicholas, John Stuart Mill: A Biography, Cambridge, 2004, 456pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521620244.

Reviewed by Fred Wilson, University of Toronto


The life of John Stuart Mill is well known – he made it so when he wrote, what has become a classic, his Autobiography. There is his education by his father to become a leader among the philosophic radicals; then the mental crisis, a period of depression when a young man; then his meeting with Harriet Taylor, and his subsequent relationship and marriage; and finally his role as a recognized public intellectual. All these features of Mill’s life are discussed in detail in the Autobiography. All those who would venture a new life have to contend with the reality of Mill’s own account. Some have done it well, some have not. Capaldi, in this new John Stuart Mill: A Biography does it well, largely following Mill’s own pattern but going well beyond him in an attempt to relate directly the various stages in Mill’s thought, his philosophy in particular, to developments in Mill’s life. His use of evidence beyond the Autobiography is always pellucid, and the exposition of Mill’s work in areas such as economics and philosophy is always clear, with these things skillfully interwoven with the narrative of events in Mill’s life.

Anyone undertaking a life of Mill faces three problems. The first is that Mill himself presented his life in the Autobiography: Mill has effectively structured how others must deal with him – the approach of the new biographer is already more or less settled. Or, since even Mill’s memory is selective, it may be that he got it wrong. In that case sticking to Mill’s own structure could prematurely close certain interpretative doors: sticking to anyone’s own structure can be a limitation. But if Mill got it wrong, then one has to respond to that, in which case your structure is again determined by Mill’s. The second is that the record of a large part of Mill’s life, his career at the East India Company – he worked there over twenty years, rising in the bureaucracy to the highest position possible – remains more or less hidden in the Company archives. The third is that Mill’s major philosophical work, the Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, so effectively demolished the positions of his opponent that they are now largely forgotten, which means Mill’s work has made itself unnecessary and therefore unknown.

I’ll comment on these problems in order.

A new Biography, if it is not to be redundant, will take up Mill’s version and argue with it, or argue with others who argue with it. The difficulty is that of striking the right balance. Capaldi does this well. Where Mill’s version is straightforward, Capaldi follows it, where Mill’s version has been challenged he attempts to as it were set the record straight. Thus, for example, Capaldi is judicious on Mill’s relationship with his father and sensible about Mill’s period of depression: he eschews the attempts at psychoanalysis that one sometimes finds. Or again, regarding the issue of the influence of Harriet Taylor on Mill’s later work, where some, such as G. Himmelfarb, have seen it to be rather less than Mill’s own effusive account of her contributions and of her virtues in general, and, indeed, have argued that where she did influence him, it was for the worse; he was led by her, it is argued, to give up, temporarily anyway, some of his more defensible claims about how to solve some social problems. Capaldi gives Mill’s text a careful reading and evaluates the other evidence, and shows that Himmelfarb’s criticisms of Mill’s account of their working relationship and her criticisms of Harriet Taylor herself are almost wholly mistaken. Not that Capaldi takes Mill’s own statements uncritically. Thus, he works into his narrative the thesis that Mill took from romantics like Coleridge a critique of what he refers to as the “Enlightenment project” – the idea that the physical sciences are a model for the social sciences, and that social problems can be solved/resolved through the application of this scientific knowledge – a critique that is much bolder in its implications than Mill himself allowed.

As for the second issue, it must be said that Capaldi’s discussion is less than satisfactory – this is the one area in Capaldi’s account of Mill’s life, I think, of which this can be said. Thornton reports that the correspondence, supervised by Mill, which the East India company in London had with native Indian governments, averaged annually ten huge vellum bound volumes, foolscap size, and five or six inches thick. (W. T. Thornton, “His [Mill’s] Career in India House,” in H. Spencer et al., John Stuart Mill: His Life and Works. Twelve Sketches [New York, 1875], p. 32.) Mill must have had a tremendous impact on India. Yet Mill himself dwelt on this aspect of life in an astonishingly brief dismissal of what he was doing for over twenty years of that life. L. Zastoupil, John Stuart Mill and India (Stanford, 1994), has established a new picture of Mill and India. Capaldi unfortunately follows Mill’s own lead rather than that of Zastoupil. Zastoupil shows how the younger Mill’s relations to India went beyond the limits of the Enlightenment project which guided his father, reflecting the impact of Coleridge’s emphasis, taken up by Mill, on the role of social institutions. Capaldi misses this opportunity to strengthen his thesis about the role of Coleridge and romantic ideas in Mill’s rejection of the Enlightenment project. But Zastoupil also locates the limitations of Mill’s thinking: like almost all his contemporaries, he was subject to the biases that Edward Said has characterized as “orientalism.”

As for the Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, Capaldi discusses in detail many of the issues that it raises, and often connects them to more recent treatments of those issues. In general, these discussions are philosophically acute. Thus, the analysis of material things into “permanent possibilities of sensation” is neatly, if briefly, done.

However, there are two points with which I would argue. They are important since they bear on the extent to which Mill rejected the Enlightenment project. Capaldi suggests that Mill in the end rejects the account, deriving from Hume and from James Mill, of the self as a bundle of impressions. In particular, Capaldi suggests that Mill returns to the old notion that we are aware in our inner experience of a self as a substance that endures through change. Capaldi cites Mill’s discussion of minds, appealing to his claim that there is a fundamental fact about those bundles that are selves which distinguishes them from bodies. The series which is a mind is “aware of itself as past and present”, and it simply is a fact, “inexplicable” by the (associationist) laws of psychology that “something which ex hypothesi is but a series of feelings can be aware of itself.” (Examination, Ch. XIII). That this fact is inexplicable does not mean that Mill has accepted a non-bundle or transcendentalist view of the self.

Another piece of evidence that Capaldi uses is a comment by Alexander Bain to the effect that Mill remained throughout his life an “idealist” (Bain, John Stuart Mill: A Criticism with Personal Recollections [London, 1882], p. 110). It seems to me that Bain is contrasting Mill to “materialists” (like Huxley?), in analyzing our beliefs about material things into propositions about our feelings, the objects of our sensory awareness, which is in one sense of the term “mental.” There is indeed a sense of ’idealism’ in which this is idealism, but if that is all that is meant then there is no real connection, as Capaldi apparently accepts, with the objective idealism of T. H. Green and F. H. Bradley and, in the background, Hegel. Certainly, within a page Bain denies that Mill commits himself to any sort of “transcendentalism,” and indeed argues that Mill was too pessimistic about the irreducibility of self-awareness to the laws of psychology.

The case, in other words, that Capaldi attempts to make for the claim that “the only coherent line of development open to him is the movement towards Hegelian absolute idealism” (p. 314) does not seem to be as strong as he thinks. Nor therefore is his argument that Mill makes a radical move from the Enlightenment project towards the absolute idealism of the romantics. The traditional view that Mill only modifies, without rejecting the Enlightenment project, remains closer to the apparent truth.

Be this as it may, Capaldi has succeeded nicely in bringing together Mill’s life and Mill’s ideas – his theories and his values – , illuminating both. This study is recommended for anyone with an interest in the man and his thought.