John Stuart Mill and the Art of Life

Placeholder book cover

Ben Eggleston, Dale E. Miller, and David Weinstein (eds.), John Stuart Mill and the Art of Life, Oxford University Press, 2011, 304pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195381245.

Reviewed by Guy Fletcher, University of Oxford


This volume aims to fill a gap in Mill scholarship on Mill's Art of Life (his theory of practical reason) and features essays by a number of distinguished Mill scholars.

The collection opens with Rex Martin's 'Mill's Utilitarianism in Context', in which he tries to distinguish two forms of Rule Utilitarianism, namely, what he calls 'Indirect Utilitarianism' and 'Ideal Utilitarianism'. He then tries to use this distinction to understand the role and nature of rules in Mill's moral theory and to argue that Mill's view contains elements of each view. A close relative of Martin's paper was published in a journal in 2008, and whilst Martin has added to this version it is still the case that little of it addresses Mill's Art of Life generally and it is largely focused on a specific issue in Mill's moral theory: namely what type of Rule Utilitarianism Mill holds. Whilst one could understand the paper reappearing here (despite the claim that the volume contains original papers) if it were of exceptional quality and/or relevance to the collection, this is not true of this paper.

The main shortcoming of the paper is a failure to make clear the central distinction Martin wants to draw between Indirect and Ideal Utilitarianism. He describes the two views as giving different answers on three issues (the grounding of rules, the allowed complexity of the rules and the conflict of rules), but the explanation leaves the reader wondering whether Martin is distinguishing two moral theories, as opposed to distinguishing between two ways of implementing Rule Utilitarianism, a worry exacerbated by his sometimes referring to the distinction as between two 'perspectives' (24). Furthermore, Martin himself concedes that the distinction between Ideal and Indirect Utilitarianism is 'often hazy' (24) and only describes himself as having 'sketched' the difference between the two, but the failure to make this difference clear undermines the paper.

In 'Interpreting Mill', David Weinstein starts (44-5) by chastising recent 'analytical advocates and detractors' of Utilitarianism for their 'disinterest' [sic] in the history of the theory and in Utilitarian versions of Liberalism. Weinstein claims that this has led to their mistaking original criticisms for 'what is really too often the ill-informed rediscovery of older criticism' (44). His main gripe, aired repeatedly, is that later wielders of the incoherence objection to Rule Utilitarianism, including Mabbott and Lyons, failed to note that F. H. Bradley made it first. In and of itself this is not especially interesting, so one would expect that Weinstein's main point is something like the claim that Bradley's version of the objection is unique, perhaps one that enables us to see why it can be answered (or could not possibly be). Whilst Weinstein suggests such a view in his introduction, he never makes sufficiently clear why neglecting Bradley is 'much to the discredit of our understanding of the liberal tradition and our efforts to enrich and shape it' (45).

The most fruitful parts of the paper occur when Weinstein discusses Mill's remarks in the Art of Life and tries to determine whether they furnish the resources to respond to the incoherence objection (answer: not clearly). He also makes some sensible and helpful observations about the dangers of anachronism in reading more precise theories into Mill. It's fair to say that the paper would have been much better had the first part -- which makes heavy weather of explaining the incoherence objection in Bradley and others -- been significantly shortened, thus allowing space to make clear why our inattention to Bradley has been detrimental.

Ben Eggleston's paper, 'Rules and Their Reasons', is another that aims to ascertain what role, if any, Mill gives to rules in determining the moral status of actions, and he also focuses on the incoherence objection. After a lengthy setup, Eggleston proceeds to: highlight the isomorphism between theories of morality and instrumental rationality, explain that an analogous incoherence objection arises for rule-based theories of instrumental rationality and briefly present the main evidence that Mill is a Rule Utilitarian.

The most interesting part of the paper is Eggleston's deployment of textual evidence from A System of Logic which suggests that Mill used the incoherence objection against those who thought that legislators should uncritically follow rules when he objected that one 'who goes by rules rather than by their reasons … like the physician who preferred that his patient should die by rule rather than recover contrary to it, is rightly judged to be a mere pedant, and the slave of his formulas.' Having highlighted the apparent inconsistency in Mill, that of endorsing a moral theory which (fairly obviously) faces a certain objection whilst deploying that same objection elsewhere, Eggleston canvasses ways of removing the inconsistency. This part of the paper is underdeveloped as the reader is left with an interesting outline of a suggestion but without time having been spent making a case for it.

Something which makes the lack of development of the end of the paper disappointing is that Eggleston claims early on that the textual evidence he presents shows that Mill is aware of the incoherence objection and, specifically, that he applies it to theories of instrumental rationality. Yet when discussing the relevant passages from Mill, Eggleston drops the latter claim. He argues that if Mill criticises the physicians for following their rules even when the rules' purposes would have been better served by breaking them, then it is 'hard to see how he could decline to regard parallel considerations as applying equally forcefully to rule-based theories of morality and instrumental rationality'. But this is to concede that Mill was not addressing theories of instrumental rationality with his objection and thus one wonders whether Eggleston's opening discussion of those theories was needed.

One puzzling feature which crops up in both Weinstein's (51) and Eggleston's (80) discussion of the incoherence objection is the claim that an essential part of this objection is the agent's knowing that better consequences would result from breaking the rules than from adhering to them in the case at hand. But this is a mistake. Suppose Rule Consequentialism is formulated in terms of actual consequences (as opposed to expected consequences) and suppose that Mandeep is in a situation where breaking a rule will bring about better consequences than adhering to it. If Rule Consequentialism is not to collapse into Act Consequentialism, then it must be that (in at least some cases of this form) the theory deems it impermissible for Mandeep to break the rules, even though adhering to them would mean that there will be less good overall. This is the incoherence objection to Rule Consequentialism and, as my presentation makes clear, it is independent of the agent's knowledge (after all, I told you nothing about what Mandeep knows).

Both Weinstein and Eggleston present the incoherence objection as if it were an objection to the Rule Consequentialist agent who has a certain combination of beliefs, namely (i) that the rules are justified by the value of their consequences, (ii) that breaking the rules in this instance would bring about better consequences and (iii) that one must, still, adhere to the rules. Whilst this is incoherent, it is the incoherence of the theory that is primary. The incoherence of the agent stems from that of the theory. Pace Weinstein and Eggleston, the incoherence objection to Rule Consequentialism does not essentially involve the agent's knowledge.

Dale Miller's 'Mill, Rule Utilitarianism, and the Incoherence Objection' is the highlight of section 1. Despite also focusing on the incoherence objection to Rule Utilitarianism, Miller does an impressive job of making substantial and informative connections with Mill's Art of Life generally. (He also makes clear that the incoherence objection is an objection primarily to Rule Consequentialism, rather than Rule Consequentialists.)

Despite finding the later parts of Miller's paper very interesting I found his opening move problematic. He starts from the claim that 'no one who advances this [incoherence] objection has given an entirely explicit statement of it' (94). This is either eccentric in focus or mistaken. Either he really means to refer only to the statements of the objection by critics of Rule Consequentialism, which would be idiosyncratic (why care only about their formulations?), or he means to say that no one has previously made the objection clear. But this latter claim is false. Brad Hooker's work, to which Miller refers, has done precisely this. Furthermore, Hooker's explanation does not suffer from making the dubitable claim, as Miller's does, that the incoherence objection involves a presumption of Moral Rationalism. This aside, Miller's discussion, his proposed solution to the incoherence objection, and his discussion of the Art of Life, was helpful.

Jonathan Riley's 'Optimal Moral Rules and Supererogatory Acts' kicks off section two of the volume. Riley's paper is a detailed explanation of what he calls Mill's 'Extraordinary Maximising Utilitarianism' and it is probably the paper most generally focused on the Art of Life, as he argues for an interpretation in which the elements of Mill's Utilitarianism map onto the threefold division of the Art of Life.

The core of Riley's paper is the claim that, for Mill, the pleasures associated with the moral sentiments are infinitely superior to any pleasures with which they might come into conflict (which is all but those pleasures connected with aesthetic sentiments of beauty and sublimity). Thus, for Riley's Mill, it can never be in an agent's interests to act immorally because the kind of pleasure that one gets from upholding the moral code (by respecting the rights of others and fulfilling one's duties) is infinitely superior to any pleasure one might get from breaking it. Riley does not spend much time arguing for this infinite superiority reading of Mill -- as opposed to the weaker readings which the key passage of Utilitarianism is consistent with -- though this is perhaps understandable as he covers a lot in the paper and writes about this issue elsewhere.

Riley argues that Mill divides conduct into three separate spheres: (i) the self-regarding sphere, (ii) the sphere of morality and law, and (iii) the sphere of competitive freedom. Surprisingly, Riley argues that supererogatory acts belong in the third category (that of competitive freedom, where agents may permissibly harm or benefit non-consenting others, such as through economic competition). Even if one finds this last claim questionable, Riley's paper does some really interesting work trying to show that this threefold division corresponds to the division in the Art of Life (Prudence or Policy, Morality, Aesthetics). Furthermore, his version of Mill's Utilitarianism, if true, yields a view that is considerably less demanding than orthodox Utilitarianism in at least two ways (though Riley does voice the worry that it might be too unorthodox to count as Utilitarianism). Firstly, it can allow for supererogatory actions and, secondly, it does not require agents to sacrifice their own interests for the sake of doing their moral duty.

Wendy Donner's 'Morality, Virtue, and Aesthetics in Mill's Art of Life' is described in the introduction as 'wide-ranging'. This is an apt description and a large part of why her essay resists summary. Her professed aim is to 'investigate some of the issues and questions that are raised by the structure of the Art of Life, in particular, questions about the relationship between Morality and Virtue or Aesthetics and about aesthetic cultivation.' Along the way Donner connects Mill's views with radical environmentalism as well as Wordsworth and Buddhism, and there is a lot of interesting discussion of diverse issues. It is not clear exactly what the overall structure of the paper is and so the reader is left unable to chart the progress of the paper whilst reading, or to say exactly what was established by the end, but I would fully expect many to find Donner's discussion rewarding.

Elijah Millgram's paper 'Mill's Incubus' is a highlight of the collection. He begins by giving an incredibly careful and informative reconstruction of Mill's view of moral unfreedom and how this relates to his famous mental crisis. Moral unfreedom, Millgram explains, is a kind of motivational structure in which an individual has motivations that cannot be trumped by any of their other motivations (either singly or collectively). Millgram diagnoses Mill's mental crisis as stemming from his being morally unfree, by having a single overriding objective (his Utilitarian commitments) which had become frozen into a habit of willing no longer affording any joy, coupled with his being unable to stop being driven by it. As Millgram puts it, Mill was a 'helpless passenger of his own life, which lurched onward beneath him like an out-of-control robot.' (178) The later part of the paper covers how the lessons that Mill learned from his mental crisis and moral unfreedom influenced his conception of utility and his attempt to design institutions and legal and social frameworks (as in The Subjection of Women) that would prevent such unfreedom from arising.

Philip Kitcher's 'Mill, Education, and the Good Life' is an attempt to show that Mill was a 'Flexible Consequentialist'. Kitcher starts from the suggestion that across a range of Mill's works we find differing conceptions of the human good and cannot plausibly reconcile them with the Hedonism explicitly defended in Utilitarianism. Kitcher contends that to get around this we should read Mill as a 'Flexible Consequentialist'. At first this might seem only to be the claim that Mill is a Consequentialist with no particular developed theory of the good, or with a more complex theory of the good than simple Hedonistic Utilitarianism, but Kitcher claims that Mill is closer to a 'really flexible' Consequentialist. A Really Flexible Consequentialist is one who regards ethics as 'an unfinished project, one that will constantly need revision and reconstruction' and one for whom 'The grand philosophical vision … of a complete theory that systematises the available phenomena is abandoned in favour of a project of continual refinement.' I must confess to not being entirely clear what this Really Flexible Consequentialism amounts to. For one thing, it is not clear why the considerations to which Kitcher appeals do not count in favour of a kind of humility and a recognition that those who do not share our conception of the human good need not be unreasonable, and that we may never secure general acceptance of the (albeit true) theory. The Flexible Consequentialist claim seems to be much stronger than this though, at least as Kitcher presents it.

One other slight niggle is that it's not clear why Kitcher describes Mill as a Flexible Consequentialist rather than a Flexible Utilitarian. However plausible Kitcher's flexible reading is, nothing he points to suggests that Mill was not a Welfarist, and given his starting point -- Mill's differing conceptions of the human good -- it is puzzling that he does not instead present Mill as a Utilitarian with a much more sophisticated, pluralist, theory of utility.

The last section of the volume begins with Robert Haraldsson's 'Taking It to Heart: Mill on Appropriation and the Art of Ethics'. Like the papers in the first section, Haraldsson's paper is also broadly concerned with the role of secondary principles in Mill's ethical theory. His specific thesis is that On Liberty should be read as addressing the problem of half-hearted belief in ethical principles. If Haraldsson is right, Mill worried about people taking the principle of utility as a first principle and using it alone in ethical decision-making, completely disregarding the important secondary principles. Haraldsson's Mill thinks that this gives too much weight to such apparent first principles and distorts our ethical thinking. Haraldsson marshals considerable textual evidence to support his claim that mere 'dull and torpid assent' is the focus of On Liberty, and he also shows how his interpretation nicely coheres with Mill's discussion of Christianity and those Christians who believe their doctrines 'just up to the point to which it is usual to act upon them.' He also applies it to Mill's harm principle in a way that yields an interesting and original interpretation of what On Liberty was intended to do.

The paper closes with a very brief description of Mill's Art of Life which doesn't do very much to show how Haraldsson’s concerns in this narrowly-focused discussion help to understand Mill's Art of Life. But his paper has much to admire in suggesting a fresh way of reading On Liberty.

When reading such volumes of papers one often wishes that there had been opportunity for the authors to revise their papers in light of the others, and in Haraldsson's case this seems especially true. There could have been an interesting discussion of how Haraldsson's interpretation of On Liberty fits with the mental crisis discussed by Millgram. But both papers are excellent already.

Nadia Urbinati's 'An Alternative Modernity: Mill on Capitalism and the Quality of Life' attempts to show how a 'dialogue with the ancients' (236) prompted Mill's reflections on modernity and in particular the danger of its distorting effects on our conceptions of happiness and the kinds of lives that we would strive to lead.

Urbinati does a convincing job of explaining what worried Mill about industrialism and capitalism, and how he sought to prevent these dangers, but even if her thesis is correct, she does not marshal compelling evidence to show that it was a dialogue with the ancients that guided Mill. She concedes that Mill 'never mentions his ancients sources directly' (241), but more importantly the overlap between the views of the ancients and Mill that she points to is inconclusive. Whilst Urbinati is right that distinctions between kinds of pleasures and the claim that those experienced in distinct types of pleasure are competent to judge their merits are found in Aristotle and Plato, this similarity is insufficient to suggest that there was some meaningful dialogue with the ancients that led Mill to reject Bentham's Hedonism (for example).

A secondary problem with the paper is Urbinati's idiosyncratic use of terminology. She makes repeated references to a 'dualism between quantitative and qualitative pleasures' such as in: 'Much more than a contribution in the revision of the utilitarian doctrine, the dualism between quantitative and qualitative pleasures reflects deeply his philosophy of life' (240). This talk is highly misleading because it unhelpfully suggests that pleasures have quantity or quality, which Mill clearly did not hold, and because the best sense one can make of it is as a dualism between higher and lower pleasures. But there is little evidence that Mill thought of pleasures as falling into only two exhaustive and exclusive categories and so talk of a 'dualism' is a distortion of Mill's view. There is also an obscure reference to the distinction between instrumental and "intrinsic" good (241, Urbinati's scare quotes) which fits neither the point that Urbinati is making nor the point that Mill makes in the passage she quotes immediately after.

Colin Heydt's paper, 'Mill, Life as Art, and Problems of Self-Description in an Industrial Age', closes the volume and is another of its highlights. It also examines Mill's worries about happiness in industrial societies. Heydt's focus is on the Aesthetic and Mill's talk of regarding our lives as works of art in particular. Heydt contends that the proper background context with which to interpret Mill's claims is a worry about the negative effects of industrial modernity -- 'inhibited regard for others', 'diminished individual happiness', 'reduced agency', 'spiritual deadening' -- and the belief that art can serve to mitigate them.

Heydt then shows how Mill, developing Ruskin's idea of beauty, thinks that art can enable us to transcend the mundane and see new possibilities for how to live, thus reducing the homogenising effects of modern life and culture. This is fleshed out by the discussion of Mill's attraction to Comte's idea of the Religion of Humanity. Heydt explains that, for Mill, coming to think of Humanity in an idealised form, and as participating in a grand struggle between good and evil, will enable us to rise above the limited, grey and insular visions of life that modernity produces. Heydt then discusses some of the various ways in which Mill sought to effect this transformation, through the development of worker cooperatives for example, and supplies abundant helpful passages from a wide range of Mill's writings in support. This is all exceedingly interesting and well done.

With respect to the volume in general, the only negatives are, first, that three of the eleven papers mine the same heavily-excavated seam (the incoherence objection to Rule Consequentialism) and, second, that the editors have not put the papers into contact. The consequence of this is that many of the writers explain the same quite basic points and the brief outline of Mill's Art of Life in the introduction is often repeated without expansion. Nonetheless, there is a lot of material worth engaging with in the volume and any scholar working on Mill's practical philosophy will be interested in a number of these papers.