John Stuart Mill and the Meaning of Life

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Elijah Millgram, John Stuart Mill and the Meaning of Life, Oxford University Press, 2019, 248pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190873240.

Reviewed by Helen McCabe, University of Nottingham


One might imagine that this book is about what John Stuart Mill can tell us about ‘the meaning of life’. It is not. Instead, it is about what Millgram thinks is wrong with analytical philosophical accounts of ‘the meaning of life’, using Mill as a reductio ad absurdum.

Millgram attempts to disprove the idea that one’s life, to have meaning, should have (or be) a project, by showing how disastrously wrong this went for Mill, whom Millgram takes to be the archetype of ‘life as project’. Indeed, Millgram goes so far as to argue that Mill’s life was ‘perverse’: rather than a life spent maximising pleasure (in accordance with the tenets of Utilitarianism), Mill deliberately avoided pleasure, even pursuing self-punishing behaviours: rather than a self-directed, active, autonomous life (in accordance with the tenets of On Liberty), Mill slavishly followed (and exaggerated the aptitude of) authority figures whose word he passively took as gospel, spending his intellectual energy on proving them correct.

Millgram starts by positing that ‘The intelligent layperson thinks of the meaning of life as one of philosophy’s central and perennial problems’ and a reason we should take philosophy seriously (p.1). He takes the dominant philosophical view to be that ‘what makes one’s life meaningful, when it is meaningful, are the projects one pursues, and that if one of these projects is large enough and central enough, identifying it will be as close as we can come to finding the meaning of one’s life’ (p.2). He takes the best proponent of this view to be David Wiggins who — as Millgram reads him — suggests that lives are meaningful ‘when, for anything that matters within the life, the explanation of why it matters will draw in . . . all of the other things that matter within the life’ (p.4). A ‘meaningless’ life would be one in which there was no ‘suitably coherent set of values’ (p.4): ‘the valuable things within a life must add up to a life’ (p.5).

This view Millgram rejects. He takes the ‘best case’ for Wiggins’ view to be ‘life projects’, and ‘since proposals about the meaning of life are . . . best thought about concretely’ he interrogates Wiggins’ view by ‘taking a long, close look at a best-case project life’ (p.7):

tell[ing] the story of Mill’s life and thought as a reductio ad absurdum, first of the view that a project ought to be the meaning of your life, and second, of the more abstract and general proposition, that justifications for your concerns should unify the valuable and important elements of your life into a highly cohesive and unified patent, one that ideally has no loose ends at all. (p.13)

His conclusion is that ‘meaningful lives of this sort are not choiceworthy, because . . . they aren’t what they are cracked up to be’ (p.13). He spends the rest of the book trying to persuade the reader ’don’t try this at home’ (p.179).

Along the way, there are several interesting passages on Mill’s philosophy (particularly his philosophy of mind, concept of ‘higher pleasures’ and positivism), but these are always digressions from the main line of argument: Mill is the archetype of a ‘project-life’, and, as his life was ‘Procrustean’ (p.177), violently forced to fit a pre-made ‘bed’, this theory must be wrong. For instance, at the end of an interesting section on Mill’s idea of higher pleasures, intellectual freedom, and ‘the free development of individuality’, Millgram breaks off to remind the reader ‘we want to stay fully aware of what we are seeing: at the bottom of his defence of intellectual liberties is John Stuart Mill trying his hardest to figure out what had gone so terribly wrong with his life’ (p.118).

There are several problems with Millgram’s approach, and thus with this book. Firstly, it is arguable whether ‘the meaning of life’ is ’philosophy’s central and perennial question’ (whether or not ‘the intelligent layperson’ thinks it ought to be — itself a moot point). More seriously, it is not clear what Millgram is arguing against regarding meaning and life: his description of the dominant view (and even Wiggins’ formulation) contains a number of disparate possibilities. Most obviously, there is slippage between lives as projects and lives having (more or less coherent) projects; between values or projects being coherent, and lives being dominated by a single value or project; and between lives having subjective meaning for the person living that life experienced via pursuing projects, lives having an objective meaning discernible to a third-party observer through the projects pursued, and the normative claim that lives, to be meaningful, should have projects. What, precisely, Mill’s ‘train wreck’ of a life (p.29) is meant to disprove, then, is hard to discern.

Millgram’s main line of argument is that Mill was ‘bred’ to be a supporter of the Utilitarian project, and also embraced it as a teenager. Then, in his famous mental ‘crisis’, he lost this faith. His associationist psychology allowed him to understand that his powers of analysis had corroded his belief, but he was unable to escape his ‘project’. Thus, deprived of a normative source of motivation for his actions, Mill was forced to rely on authority figures (his father and Bentham initially, later Harriet and then Helen Taylor) for motivations. And because, underneath, he knew this was inauthentic, he exaggerated their abilities in his mind (and writings) in order to persuade himself that in following them, and ‘making up’ arguments to prove their ideas correct, he was doing the right thing (pp.73-78).

This seems a perverse way of reading Mill’s view of his father and Bentham, and particularly his co-authoring relationship with Harriet and Helen Taylor. Indeed, at one point Millgram likens utilitarianism to ‘a totalitarian micro-state’, and says Mill ‘took orders’ from his father, and later Harriet Taylor making — it would seem – Bentham out to be Marx or Lenin; James Mill, Stalin; Harriet Taylor, Khrushchev and Helen Taylor Brezhnev (p.132). It seems a stretch even to liken utilitarianism to a cult — it does not need saying that it was nothing like the USSR.

Indeed, Millgram does not offer a very persuasive account of Mill’s life. Key moments in Millgram’s account are based on unpersuasive reasons. For instance, he argues Mill’s ‘crisis’ arose not from the causes Mill himself gives, but from finally reading Bentham’s work for himself, and realising just how poor, narrow-minded, and appallingly written they were (pp.53-58). That Mill perversely denied himself the pleasures of fine dining is ‘proved’ by the fact that he ate ‘the same inedible breakfast every day for most of his life’ (p.29). This turns out actually to be the very edible (indeed, enjoyable) breakfast of boiled egg, bread-and-butter, and tea, served every day at his office (p.191), which a lot of people would consider a pleasure, not masochism.

Millgram does not try to give a balanced or holistic view of Mill’s life — he simply uses it to make his case that lives-as-projects ’aren’t what they’re cracked up to be’, and twists all the elements of Mill’s life and writing to suit his narrative. Utilitarians may well have concerns about this book in the way it portrays key figures in the utilitarian movement: Kantians may feel disquiet about the extent to which Millgram is willing to use Mill as a means to his own argumentative ends rather than treat him as an end in himself.

It is true that Mill’s generosity in praising not only his wife, step-daughter, father and mentor, but also many of his other friends and acquaintances, is a distinctive feature of the Autobiography. But even if we agree we should take Mill’s praise with pinch of salt, the rest of Millgram’s account entirely disregards Mill’s own view of his life. Not only from the Autobiography, but from Mill’s letters and diaries, we get a sense of someone grateful for, and contented with, the life he had lived, and the success of the projects he pursued, even while acknowledging the blight of personal tragedies and political disappointments. Millgram’s account also disregards most third-party assessments of Mill’s life as not only being successful, but meaningful precisely because Mill wrestled with the ‘programming’ of his upbringing to become someone leading a self-directed life. Although Millgram touches on Mill’s psychology and compatibilism, he does not see Mill as exercising free will either before or after his ‘crisis’. Moreover, it ignores a wide range of things not directly connected with the utilitarian project Mill did, and found pleasure in doing (walking, playing the piano, his cat, his canaries, botany . . . ).

Millgram offers this summary:

The argument turned on seeing what the workings of a life-project must be, and the upshot was that the idealised project life, in which it occupies the entire life, is carried through whole-heartedly, and exhibits an agent’s unified selfhood . . . is not so much an option one can in fact entertain. (p.174)

That is, the ‘workings’ of a project-life are impossible, and thus so is project-life and thus the desirability of such a project is moot. This seems an odd conclusion, given that Mill did have a life — a project-life is not, then, entirely infeasible (someone has had one). Moreover, Millgram seems to be taking a very hard line on ‘entire life’, which we might push back on. If Mill’s childhood experiences meant he was incapable of living a self-directing life later, then this would suggest that, to have meaning, projects need to be authentically chosen in adulthood, or at least authentically re-affirmed in adulthood (as one might already say, for instance, about child film-stars, sports sensations or musical and mathematical prodigies).

Indeed, the more Millgram emphasises that Mill’s ‘project’ was chosen for him, not by him, the less persuasive the whole exercise becomes in defeating the idea that, to be meaningful, lives ought to have projects — or, at least, in defeating any interesting and plausible version of that view, in which such projects would have to be reflectively endorsed, chosen and pursued. But Millgram does not explore the possible nuances of the life-as-project view.

Millgram’s account of the ‘workings’ (i.e., psychological and motivational underpinnings and processes) of Mill’s life is not very convincing. Moreover, we might think Mill’s life more unique than most, and thus that he is not a good case-study for Millgram’s cause. The ‘self-contradiction’ (as Millgram sees it) of Mill’s life could be something peculiarly to do with utilitarianism (if we try to single-mindedly pursue the maximisation of general happiness, perhaps we are necessarily doomed to be unhappy ourselves, for some interesting psychological reason). It could have something to do with the fact that — at least at the beginning of his life — this was not a project Mill chose, but one for which he was chosen. A life spent negotiating the legacy of a father like James Mill and a mentor like Bentham, and the education to which they subjected Mill, might well lead to a life in which the pursued project was not authentic, and thus not really ‘coherent’ with one’s own personality. But, as Millgram sees it, neither of these root causes for Mill’s life going wrong are generalizable. Thus, Mill’s life cannot render the idea that lives have meaning if they have projects (or that to be meaningful, they ought to have projects) necessarily absurd.

Much of this book has been, as Millgram acknowledges, ‘upcycled’ from previous published work: there is not much new here if one is familiar with Millgram’s opus. He says he hopes to pursue what would be newer material — that is, a positive account of composing meaningful lives which are not ‘imposingly monolithic’ ‘on another occasion’ (p.179). On this occasion, Millgram misses a trick. Mill saw himself as a ‘manufactured man’, and fought hard to become a self-directed, self-developing being. Millgram almost entirely overlooks this change, or disbelieves that it really occurred. In doing so, he misses the real meaning of Mill’s life, and the lessons it might teach.