Joint Commitment: How We Make the Social World

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Margaret Gilbert, Joint Commitment: How We Make the Social World, Oxford University Press, 2014, 449pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199970148.

Reviewed by Seumas Miller, Charles Sturt University/Delft University of Technology


This is a collection of eighteen of Margaret Gilbert's previously published essays. They are arranged in four sections: Part I - Shared Agency: Ch. 1 Acting Together; Ch. 2 Considerations on Joint Commitment; Ch. 3 Who's to Blame?; Ch. 4 Rationality in Collective Action; Ch. 5 Two Approaches to Shared Intention; Part II - Collective Attitudes: Ch. 6 Belief and Acceptance as Features of Groups; Ch. 7 Collective Epistemology; Ch. 8 Shared Values, Social Unity, and Liberty; Ch. 9 Social Convention Revisited; Ch. 10 Collective Guilt Feelings; Part III -- Mutual Recognition, Promises and Love: Ch. 11 Fusion: Sketch of a Contractual Model; Ch. 12 Scanlon on Promissory Obligation: The Problem of Promisees' Rights; Ch. 13 Three Dogmas about Promising; Ch. 14 Mutual Recognition and Some Related Phenomena; Part IV -- Political Life: Ch. 15 A Real Unity of Them All; Ch. 16 Pro Patria: An Essay on Patriotism; Ch. 17 De-Moralizing Political Obligation; Ch. 18 Commands and Their Practical Import.

Gilbert is an influential figure in the recently emerged sub-field referred to variously as collective intentionality, social ontology among others. Work in this area is concerned with issues in the philosophy of social entities and social actions. This book revolves around Gilbert's notion of joint commitment. As Gilbert sees it, joint commitments are centrally constitutive of collective actions and attitudes, the practice of promising, conventions, political obligations and so on as per the above set of chapter headings. As the sub-title suggests, joint commitment is evidently by her lights the most fundamental social concept. As is fitting, she applies it in a wide variety of contexts, and the result is a wide-ranging and lively set of essays. Importantly, she applies her theoretical notion to questions in political philosophy and thereby connects abstract theory to real world concerns,something most theorists in this sub-field have not yet done. While many of the essays are well-known to those working in the field, it is useful to have them collected in one place, not the least because it facilitates development of an overview of her oeuvre.

What is Gilbert's notion of joint commitment? She distinguishes personal from joint commitment. However, in neither case is commitment to be understood as moral commitment. Personal commitment is the commitment an agent has to proceeding with a course of action once he or she has decided on it on the basis of some reason or other: "One who has decided to do something is thereby committed to do that thing. . . . If one is subject to a commitment, reason requires one to act in accordance with that commitment" (p. 31). Commitments in Gilbert's sense, whether merely personal or joint, are normative matters, albeit not moral ones. Specifically, if one fails to carry out one's decision without having changed it, then one will be in error and, therefore, subject to pejorative criticism (even if only self-criticism). Thus: "if, for example, Jack decides to go swimming tomorrow and does not change his mind, then, all else being equal, he will act in error if he fails to go swimming tomorrow. This could happen if, for example, when tomorrow comes, he forgets his decision until it is too late" (p. 6). This thin normative notion (as I shall christen it) is essentially that of success or failure, and arises in cases such as failure to stick to one's decisions or plans or to realise one's intentions, and the failure also, I suggest, of one's judgements to be true or correct ones.

Thin normativity should be contrasted not only with moral normativity (so to speak) but also with two other distinct notions of normativity. The first of these is the normativity constitutive of certain emotionally laden interpersonal relationships, such as friendship, parental and sexual love and the like. This has a moral flavour but is different from morality understood in more impartialist and episodic terms. The second is the inherently socio-normative dimensions of established social and institutional forms such as conventions, laws and institutions. A failure to comply with the law or a prevailing convention is not the same kind of thing as a failure to carry out a discrete individual or joint decision, intention or plan. Indeed, it may be that one or more individuals are deliberately breaking the law or a convention in order to realise some individual or joint intention, plan or goal.

Consider, for example, two petty criminals, A and B, who successfully perform the following joint action: A stops C in the street asking for directions while B removes C's wallet. The joint action realises A and B's intentions, plan and goal while violating law and convention. Qua joint action it is a success. Thus, if the attempted joint action had failed as a result of B forgetting to take the wallet because distracted by C's handsome visage, then A may well criticise B for his error in action and B accept the criticism. By contrast, if A and B succeed in their joint action they violate C's institutional, notably legal, rights, they breach conventions of behaviour and they are liable for punitive and other sanctions; whereas if they fail none of this might apply, since, after all, asking for directions is not a crime or even a breach of convention. A further point is that these various social forms give rise to conceptual sub-divisions of normativity (so to speak), e.g., legal, conventional, etc.

Gilbert argues that joint, as opposed to personal, commitments arise, in the first instance at least, in the context of what are typically referred to in the literature as joint actions. Gilbert's favourite examples of joint action are simple small group, especially two person, activities such as walking together (the topic of Ch. 1) and painting a room together. However, she applies her account to social forms, such as conventions (Ch. 9), and joint activities conducted by large populations over long periods of time, e.g., joint activity supportive of political institutions (Ch. 16 and Ch. 17).

According to Gilbert, two or more agents are jointly committed in the requisite sense if they are "jointly committed to espouse a certain goal as a body" (p. 31). Moreover, other things being equal, they will be thus jointly committed if each "expresses [his] readiness to be jointly committed to espouse the relevant goal as a body, in conditions of common knowledge" (p. 32). Here the expression "as a body" can be glossed as "as a unit" (p. 33). Common knowledge has various formulations in the literature, and Gilbert offers her own (p. 51), but, roughly speaking, it is common knowledge between A and B that p if A truly believes that p, B truly believes that p, A truly believes that B believes that p and so on.

As just mentioned, the joint commitment is somehow created by each expressing his readiness to be jointly committed. Gilbert says: "their two expressions [in the two person case] create the whole when and only when both expressions are in place" (p. 32). However, there are two 'wholes' in play here and they need to be kept separate, at least conceptually. One of these is composed of the two expressions of readiness; the second is the joint commitment that might be created by, or otherwise follow upon, these expressions of readiness. And, of course, the joint commitment needs to be distinguished from the joint action that might be constituted in part by, and flow from, this joint commitment.

Expressions of readiness to jointly commit are, presumably, communications. Further, such a communication, if it is successful, consists of two individual relational actions: A communicates p (A's readiness) to B and, likewise, B communicates p (B's readiness) to A. So a question arises as to how we get from (a), two communications (whether taken singly or as a unit) of readiness to jointly commit, to (b), joint commitment. In Gilbert's view "the offering of these expressions, in conditions of common knowledge suffices for the joint commitment in question to be established" (p. 398). However, it is unclear that this is so and, if it is, why it is. After all, if A communicates to B his readiness to commit to performing an individual action, it does not follow that A is in fact thus committed (assuming "commit" here means something other than readiness to commit); rather it simply alerts B to A's state of readiness.

Naturally, A and B might in communicating be making an agreement to perform a joint action. But they might not be; and it is implausible that every joint action presupposes an agreement to perform it. In any case, Gilbert argues that agreement is not necessary to establish a joint commitment and is not constitutive of joint commitment in her sense (pp. 26-28).

What, then, is Gilbert's notion of joint commitment? According to Gilbert, "The relevant joint commitment is an instruction to the parties to see to it that they act in such a way as to emulate as best they can a single body with the goal in question" (p. 33). So, as one would hope, joint commitment does fall short of joint action; after all, instructions are not necessarily followed. According to Gilbert, joint commitments give rise to an obligation (or set of obligations) and, indeed in her view, a right (or set of rights). Moreover, the rights and obligations in question cannot be unilaterally rescinded but only jointly (p. 34 and p. 107). Let us refer to this normative, indeed deontic, notion of Gilbert's as J commitment. Importantly, and contra what Gilbert claims, J commitment is not commitment in the thin sense. For the latter is a mental act of an agent (e.g., a decision or intention) not necessarily giving rise to an obligation or right; commitment in the thin sense is not deontic.

As we have seen, J commitment is not a species of moral commitment (or of commitment in the thin sense). But nor should J commitment be identified with any of the other notions of commitment identified earlier, namely, emotional, interpersonal relationship-based commitment, or the normativity inherent in established social forms such as conventions, laws and institutions. For these latter forms of normativity are insufficiently general for Gilbert's purposes. Other things being equal, J commitment arises in each and all joint actions. This is not the case for any of these other normative notions. Some joint actions take place between friends, but many do not; some joint actions are governed by conventions or laws, but many are not, and so on. This leaves us with two problems. Firstly, what is J commitment if none of the above? Is it, perhaps, a sui generis phenomenon that arises from all and only joint actions?

The second problem arises from Gilbert's definitions of conventions, polities and so on; e.g., "A population P has a convention of conformity to some regularity in behaviour R in situations of type S if and only if the members of Pare jointly committed to accept as a body, with respect to themselves, the fiat: R is to be conformed to" (p. 219, my emphasis), and "a number of persons together constitute a polity if and only if at a minimum, they are jointly committed to support and uphold as a body a particular set of political institutions" (p. 363, my emphasis). How can Gilbert consistently deploy this monistic deontic notion of J commitment in definitions not only of simple, one-off joint actions but also of conventions, whole political societies and so on? For, as noted, the normative notions in play in these established social forms are quite different from those inherent in simple, one-off joint actions; indeed, the normative notions in play among these diverse social forms appear to be different from one another.

As we saw above, Gilbert's notion of joint commitment -- a notion constituted in part by a (sui generis?) form of commitment, namely, J commitment -- is a species of communication. So the question arises: Who or what is the communicator? Who or what is issuing the instruction? Surely it cannot be the set of agents per se, i.e., the "the unit" or "single body"; since presumably only entities with minds of their own can issue instructions (implicit or otherwise). Indeed, given the sophisticated nature of many of the joint actions to be analysed (e.g., political actions), arguably any minds issuing such instructions must be able to do so in a human language and must be possessed of consciousness. However, the idea of a conscious group mind is apparently ruled out by Gilbert (p.9), though perhaps not the idea of a group agent per se (plural subject, in her parlance). Another possibility is that the instruction must be one issued by each individual to each of all the other individuals. Perhaps this is what she means by: "All commit all" (p. 398).

What, finally, is the relation, as Gilbert sees it, between joint commitment and joint action? She says:

two or more people are acting together if they are jointly committed to espousing as a body a certain goal, and each one is acting in a way appropriate to the achievement of that goal, where each one is doing this in light of the fact that he or she is subject to a joint commitment to espouse the goal in question as a body. (p. 34)

So evidently the deontic notion of J commitment provides a reason for action.

Gilbert contrasts her joint commitment account with individualist conceptions. She refers to proponents of these as singularists (Ch. 5), among whom she includes Michael Bratman and myself.[1] In doing so she offers the example of Ned and Olive walking to the top of the hill together. Let me first analyse her example in terms of my own collective end account (CET) before turning to her criticisms. According to CET: (i) Ned is intentionally walking up the hill and Olive is doing likewise, (ii) while individually walking Ned is trying to ensure that he is walking in close proximity to Olive and she is doing likewise; (iii) their shared goal is to reach the top of the hill; (iv) they have common knowledge with respect to (i), (ii) and (iii). Note that the shared goal or end is interdependent since it cannot be realised by one agent acting alone. This being so, the label "relational individualism" is more apt than "singularism".

For the purpose of comparing her own account with 'singularism', Gilbert qualifies the Ned/Olive example in a number of ways. Early on Ned realised he would only make it half way up the hill but refrained from informing Olive (p. 103-4). Indeed, according to Gilbert (p. 104) it may be that Olive also realises she won't make it to the top yet refrains from mentioning this to Ned. Clearly in these circumstances neither Ned nor Olive now intends to get to the top of the hill; nor does there continue to be a shared goal (collective end, in my parlance) to do so. Notwithstanding the absence of these intentions and the collective end, according to Gilbert they continue to have what she refers to as a shared intention. They do so by virtue of the agreement that they made which in turn gave rise to a joint commitment. Says Gilbert: "According to a firm pre-theoretical judgment, an agreement to do something immediately gives rise to a shared intention" (p. 104).

What are we to make of this example? According to CET, Ned and Olive are no longer engaged in joint action since neither intends individually to get to the top of the hill and there is no longer a collective end to do so. Moreover, and consistent with my CET analysis, by virtue of their (explicit or implicit) agreement, they might continue to have, at least for a time, a joint moral obligation, and perhaps even a joint moral right,[2] to do so. After all, the agreement is presumably still in place.

Naturally, if Gilbert wants to define shared intention in terms of her deontic notion of J commitment, then she is entitled to do so. Evidently, she does so want since she states: "an adequate account of shared intention will entail that each party to a shared intention is obligated to each to act as appropriate to the shared intention in conjunction with the rest" (p. 108). But a shared intention in this sense is more than, or otherwise different from, a mental state such as an intention or a collective end.

The question that now arises is whether a shared intention in Gilbert's sense includes the mental states constitutive of the collective end (or like individualist) theory, namely, individual intentions, shared goals, and so on. If it does, then, contra what Gilbert asserts, Ned and Olive do not have a shared intention, for they have abandoned any intention or goal to reach the top of the hill. On the other hand, perhaps a shared intention is merely the deontic properties constitutive of J commitment. If so, then conceivably Gilbert is correct in claiming that Ned and Olive continue to have a shared intention, notwithstanding that each no longer has the individual intentions, shared goals, etc. in question. Nevertheless, the question asked above now intrudes. What is a J commitment? And there is this further question: What role, if any, is it playing here? For although a J commitment is deontic in character it does not consist of the moral rights and obligations constitutive of an agreement; J commitments are non-moral in character. Yet it is the existence of an agreement that is the obvious source of any rights or obligations present in the example; J commitment looks to be superfluous.

In the context of Gilbert's criticism of individualist accounts, I have been emphasising the elusive nature of the deontic notion of J commitment. What of the other normative commitments; commitments that self-evidently exist? Let us perform a brief comparative evaluation of the joint commitment account and CET. Obviously, normativity in the thin sense applies directly to the constitutive elements of CET, namely, intentions, beliefs and ends, in the manner explained above. Moreover, both individual and joint obligations, be they moral or otherwise, are congruent with CET. They might arise from an agreement to perform a joint action, as in the Ned and Olive case. Alternatively, Ned and Olive might have felt obligations to one another by virtue of their interpersonal relationship as, say, friends. Again, on CET joint actions governed by conventions, laws, institutions and the like may well take on a variety of deontic properties, e.g., the joint institutional duties of the members of a university committee to jointly make a hiring decision. Moreover, both individual and joint moral obligations, in particular, may arise from the nature of the collective end, e.g., the collective end of two passers-by to bring a drowning child to shore. What of the joint commitment account?

Consider the following example of a one-off joint action that does not seem to have any deontic character and, therefore, any J commitment. It has just this minute become common knowledge between two strangers, John and Mary, standing in adjacent, locked (from the outside), communication-proof, hotel rooms that each would like to eat a bar of chocolate and that each can do so. However, there is a catch. At this time the only available chocolate bars are dispensed by a device fixed in the wall between the two rooms, and the use of this device requires a joint action on their part. Each has to place a key in the slot on his or her side of the device within the next five minutes. Perhaps they arrived at this common knowledge by way of a third party, perhaps by way of their own independent investigations. No matter; common knowledge between A and B that p does not entail any communication between A and B. Surely John will insert his key and Mary her key and, in doing so, they will each separately receive a chocolate bar. But there is no communication with respect to one another's readiness to J commit; for ex hypothesi there is no communication at all. For the same reason there is no agreement. Moreover, there are no conventions, laws or other established social forms in play; and John and Mary are strangers, so there are no emotional interpersonal relationship-based commitments. Further, there are no moral rights or obligations in play. Indeed, it seems that there are no deontic properties of any kind in play; so there is no J commitment. So we have joint action but not J commitment. So the deontic notion of J commitment constitutive of Gilbert's joint commitment theory of joint action is not a necessary feature of joint action; so much the worse for the joint commitment theory.

Naturally, Mary might be irritated by John's failure to do his part if, for example, John gets distracted by a fly on the wall and fails to insert his key in time. Indeed, John will likely be irritated with himself. Both are irritated because John's lapse has prevented both from achieving what both wanted, namely, that each get a chocolate bar (albeit each wanted his or her own taste for chocolate to be satisfied more than each wanted the other's taste for chocolate to be satisfied). The irritation each experiences is based on John's failure to act fully rationally; he acts in error (as Gilbert says). Importantly, this failure is the joint action analogue to Gilbert's personal commitment in the case of individual action; this is a failure to meet one's thin commitments. This suggests that rational commitment in this thin normative sense is what is constitutive of joint action in general rather than Gilbert's much stronger and different deontic normative notion of J commitment. To this extent CET is to be preferred.

Now consider a related, but importantly different, version of the scenario. In this second scenario the device in the wall is a bomb and it has just this minute become common knowledge between John and Mary that they will both be blown up in five minutes unless they jointly defuse the bomb. However, it is also common knowledge between them that there is a way to save their lives. This is for John to insert the device's key into the device in the wall of this room within five minutes and for Mary to do likewise with her key. Surely John will insert his key and Mary her key and, in doing so, they will jointly save their lives. As in the chocolate scenario, there is no communication, and so no communication with respect to one another's readiness to J commit (and no agreement). Nor, let us assume, is there any convention or law governing this kind of situation in the community and jurisdiction in which they find themselves. However, there are moral obligations in play; indeed, there are joint moral obligations. Specifically, John has a moral obligation, jointly held with Mary, to insert his key into the device and, likewise, so has Mary. These jointly held moral obligations are derivable from the morally weighty collective end that they have to save their lives.

In contrast with Gilbert's joint commitment account, CET emphasises the moral importance of the particular collective ends in play in some joint activities, notably joint institutional activity in the service of morally significant collective goods, such as security and aggregate individual freedom.[3] Specifically, on CET political obligation is to a significant extent, albeit not wholly, derived from the moral importance of the collective goods that are at stake in supporting or failing to support particular political institutions; therefore, political obligation has an inherent moral dimension. This contrasts with Gilbert's conception in which rights and obligations (J commitments) are essentially derived from participation in joint activity per se and, therefore, more or less irrespective of the nature of the ends of that activity. Hence, her notion of political obligation that does not have an inherent moral dimension.

Here we need to distinguish inherently political institutions, such as government, from other social institutions, such as universities, and distinguish, also, morally acceptable institutions from inherently morally unacceptable ones. The claim that the commitments to social and political institutions with a morally acceptable purpose are buttressed by joint participation in those institutions is consistent with both CET and Gilbert's conception. What of joint participation in political institutions with a morally unacceptable purpose, such as a totalitarian government? Such participation is straightforwardly inconsistent with CET. By contrast, on Gilbert's account joint participation in, and support for, a totalitarian government generates (non-moral) commitments, which, I hasten to add, are then overridden by moral considerations. But surely such participation and supportive activity ought not generate any commitments (political or otherwise) since they ought to be repugnant in the first instance. Moreover, on Gilbert's conception, but not CET, there is evidently the possibility of political activity without a moral purpose. In the context of an excess of naked political ambition and political activity undertaken for its own sake in the governing assemblies of contemporary democracies, this is not an attractive prospect. That said, Gilbert offers a distinctive perspective on these issues and is to be applauded for putting them on the collective intentionality/social ontology agenda.

[1] Michael Bratman, "Shared Intention," Ethics 104 1993, pp. 97-113; and Seumas Miller "Joint Action" Philosophical Papers vol. xxi no.3 1992, pp. 275-299, and Social Action: A Teleological Account, Cambridge University Press, 2001, Ch. 2.

[2] See Miller, Social Action, op. cit., Ch. 7 for an individualist analysis of joint rights and joint obligations.

[3] Seumas Miller, The Moral Foundations of Social Institutions: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge University Press, 2010, Ch. 2.