Joint Ventures: Mindreading, Mirroring, and Embodied Cognition

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Alvin I. Goldman, Joint Ventures: Mindreading, Mirroring, and Embodied Cognition, Oxford University Press, 2013, 344pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199874187.

Reviewed by Ian Ravenscroft, Flinders University


The title Joint Ventures alludes to Goldman's view that understanding cognition requires both scientific and philosophical expertise. "It would be", he notes, "intellectually irresponsible to ignore the huge swaths of evidence and theory that science has generated" (p. 3). Nevertheless, there is "ample place for philosophers to make theoretical contributions, to argue for this or that theoretical interpretation as the best explanation of the data" (p. 3). Cognitive science is thus a joint venture between philosophy and the behavioral sciences (p. 2). The rich and fascinating essays in this collection are testimony to Goldman's vision. The volume focuses on four themes to which he has made important contributions: simulation theory, empathy, embodied cognition, and the metaphysics of action. I will focus on the first three themes because they are striking examples of the "joint ventures" program.

Simulation theory

Goldman has been a central figure in the study of mindreading for the last quarter of a century. The term "mindreading" refers to the capacity to predict others' behavior and explain it by attributing mental states to them. This capacity is also commonly referred to as "theory of mind". However, as Goldman points out, "theory of mind" confuses mindreading with a model of mindreading (p. 20). (This will become apparent in a moment.)

Broadly speaking, three models of mindreading exist in the literature (Ch. 1):

1. Theory-theory. Mindreading centrally involves the possession of a theory of mind ("folk psychology") which is deployed in roughly the same way that scientists deploy empirical theories to predict and explain aspect of the natural world.

2. The intentional stance. Mindreading involves taking a "stance" towards other people. They are assumed to be rational agents and the beliefs and desires attributed to them are those that a fully rational agent would have in the target's circumstances. The agent's behavior is predicted on the basis of the attributed states.

3. Simulation theory. The mindreader adopts the target's perspective and determines what she (the mindreader) would do if she were the target. That is, she uses her own mental processors to simulate those of the target, thereby predicting their behavior.

Goldman is without doubt the most significant simulation theorist. His earliest contribution greatly clarified simulation theory, moving it away from loose metaphors such as "putting oneself in the other's shoes" ('Interpretation Psychologized', Mind and Language 4: 161-85, 1989). His views are best understood using the terminology, developed by Stephen Stich and Shaun Nichols, of "pretend inputs" and "off-line outputs" ('Folk psychology: Simulation or Tacit Theory?', Mind and Language 7: 35-71, 1992). The pretend belief that p has the same impact on practical decision making as the belief that p, but differs from the belief that p because it originates in different mental processes. Beliefs arise from perception and memory, and by reasoning from other beliefs; pretend beliefs arise from what is often called the "pretend belief and desire generator". Similarly, the pretend desire that q has the same impact on practical decision making as the desire that q, but also arise from the pretend belief and desire generator.

In a successful episode of mindreading, the mindreader generates pretend beliefs and desires corresponding to the target's beliefs and desires. Provided the mindreader's decision making processes are sufficiently similar to the target's, she will arrive at a decision similar to the target's. However, the mindreader's decision does not lead directly to behavior; rather, her practical decision making processors are "off-line", with the decision leading to a prediction about the target's behavior (pp. 51-2).

What about explaining the target's behavior in mentalistic terms? Simulation theorists have suggested that explaining behavior relies on a process of "generate-and-test". Say I see Tamara going to the cafe. To explain her action I generate pretend belief-desire pairs until I locate a pair that causes my practical decision maker, taken off-line, to output "Go to the cafe". The pretend desire that I want a coffee and the pretend belief that coffee is available in the cafe lead me to decide (off-line) to go to the cafe. Consequently I attribute "real" versions of these states to Tamara. But this idea strikes me as implausible because there is an indefinite number of pretend belief-desire pairs that would lead to the prediction that Tamara will go the cafe. (Tamara wants a newspaper and believes the easiest place to get one is in the cafe; Tamara wants to find her friend and believes he is in the cafe; and so on.) Clearly the generate-and-test hypothesis needs to be refined or discarded.

The essays on mindreading reflect two important aspects of Goldman's work on simulation theory. First, Ch. 3 indicates the way in which he (with Chandra Sekhar Sripada) has extended simulation theory to provide new models of face-based emotion recognition (FaBER). Surprisingly, FaBER has received little attention in the mindreading literature. One of Goldman's simulationist models (75-9) relies on the well-established claim that mimicking the facial expression of an emotion typically causes the experience of that emotion. Say that the target is angry and facially expresses that anger. If the mindreader can successfully mimic the target's facial expression, she too will feel angry. She then recognizes the target's expression as anger. This model has the virtue of explaining why people who are unable to experience a particular emotion because of impairment to the relevant brain area also have trouble attributing that emotion to others (pp. 65-8). However, as Goldman notes, some experimental results are inconsistent with the model (79).

The second important aspect of Goldman's approach to simulation theory is the connection he draws between simulation theory and work on mirror neurons (Ch. 2 with Vittorio Gallese; Ch 4; and Ch. 5 with Lucy Jordan). Mirror neurons were initially discovered in the macaque monkey in the 1990s. They are activated both when the macaque sees another macaque (or human) perform an action, and when it initiates an action of that type itself. Importantly, the initiated action is not generally executed. Mirror neurons were subsequently discovered in humans.

It is obvious why Goldman is excited about mirror neurons. The actions of the observed person are re-enacted in the observer up to the point of execution. We might say that the observer generates a pretend plan of action that correlates with the other's plan of action, but that the mechanism that takes the pretend plan as input is off-line (p. 54). Goldman does not claim that these mirroring events instantiate full-blown mindreading; rather, he restricts himself to the much more plausible claim that mirror neuron systems might be a "primitive version" or a "precursors in phylogeny" of the simulationist mechanism that underlie human mindreading (p. 5).


Let's turn now to the second major theme in the collection, empathy. Simulationist models of the cognitive capacity to re-enact another's emotions are very attractive. The empathizer imagines herself in the target's position thereby creating pretend inputs into her affective system. If her imaginings are sufficiently accurate, and her affective system sufficiently similar to the target's, the empathizer will experience the target's emotions herself (p. 186-8).

However, empathy is usually taken to involve more than emotional re-enactment: it also includes an appropriate moral response to the target's plight. I see the cyclist has been hit by a car; I share his distress; and I phone for an ambulance. Goldman makes this point as follows, "To empathize with someone, in its most frequent sense, is to sympathize or commiserate, which involves shared attitudes, sentiments, or emotions" (p. 186). But whilst the simulationist approach to emotional re-enactment is very attractive, a simulationist account of the moral response would need careful elaboration. Say I see a person in a pain. My moral response is to assist her. However, her moral response may be self-directed contempt that she is not more stoic. There is no straightforward mirroring of the sufferer's moral response in this case.

Embodied cognition

Orthodox cognition scientists typically think of cognition as potentially disembodied. This is not to say that they are dualists; rather, they think of cognition largely in terms of the generation and manipulation of representations that could, in principle, occur in a physical system quite unlike the human body. (This is a legacy of functionalism's commitment to in-principle multiple realizability.)

In contrast, the more recent program of embodied cognition argues that human cognition is intimately connected with the human body. Goldman's preferred approach to embodied cognition has three core ideas. To grasp the first core idea we need his concept of a B-format ("B" for "body-oriented"). B-formats are "hypothesized mental codes that are primarily, or fundamentally, utilized in forming interoceptive or directive representations of one's own bodily states and activities" (p. 233). B-formats represent bodily states from an internal perspective rather than an external or third person perspective, and play a key role in activities such as proprioception and kinesthesis (p. 236). I have to admit that -- and the fault may be mine, not Goldman's -- the B-format concept is not clear to me. My best guess is that a B-format is a state that, on the one hand, represents a property of the body from an internal perspective and, on the other, is poised for immediate control of the relevant part of the body without further complex processing. If this is right, mirror neurons provide a good example of B-formats. It would be very helpful if the idea of a B-format were spelt out with greater clarity. Be that as it may, Goldman's first key idea is that B-formats play a significant role in human cognition.

This brings us to Goldman's second key idea -- the massive redeployment hypothesis. "Redeployment" refers to the way neural circuits that evolved to perform one function can be exapted to perform a second function, often without losing the first function. "Massive" refers to the claim that this kind of neural redeployment is widespread in the human brain. Finally, Goldman claims that B-formats are often massively redeployed to support sophisticated cognitive processing including, for example, counting (p. 240).

Goldman's is a modest embodied cognition thesis (p. 233). He claims that some important cognitive functions are performed by redeployed B-formats, not that all or most do so. Moreover, unlike some advocates of embodied cognition who have abandoned representational theories of mind, Goldman is comfortable with representation.

Brief methodological conclusion

Goldman's idea of "joint ventures" is attractive. He quite rightly complains that the vast majority of philosophers of mind who self-identify as physicalists and naturalists nevertheless spend almost no time discussing empirical results from the behavioral sciences (p. 3). We might add that, when they do, they tend to focus on a small number of examples: blindsight, split-brain experiments, multiple personality disorder, and so on. Goldman has an encyclopedic knowledge of cognitive science, reflected in the richness of these essays.

But I am unconvinced by the "joint ventures" program: I don't think it goes far enough. I doubt that there is much of a role for philosophy in the study of the mind. It's striking how little philosophy there is in the eleven "joint ventures" chapters in the collection. Recall Goldman's claim that there is "ample place for philosophers to make theoretical contributions, to argue for this or that theoretical interpretation as the best explanation of the data" (p. 3). But there is nothing especially philosophical about these activities. Scientists are very, very good at finding the best explanations for their data, and have developed sophisticated techniques for doing so.

It is true that philosophers of mind have proposed new models of empirical phenomena (e.g., simulation theory). And Daniel Dennett famously proposed the so-called "false belief task" that drove research on the development of mindreading for more than a decade. But these examples are insignificant compared with the theoretical endeavors of the scientists. Notice too that Goldman makes no mention of standard philosophical tools in his account of the role of philosophy in cognitive science. No conceptual analysis; no appeals to semantics; nothing about ordinary language; no metaphysics; no thought experiments; no possible worlds.

Joint Ventures is a brilliant book by a great researcher. But I don't think Goldman was doing great philosophy -- I think he was doing great science. And I suspect that deep down Goldman believes this too. But that's just a guess.