Creating Future People: The Ethics of Genetic Enhancement

Creating Future People The Ethics Of Genetic Enhancement Book Cover

Jonathan Anomaly, Creating Future People: The Ethics of Genetic Enhancement, Routledge, 2020, 109pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780367203122.

Reviewed by Colin Farrelly, Queen's University


Jonathan Anomaly's book describes itself as a "fast- paced primer on how new genetic technologies will enable parents to influence the traits of their children" and this book ably delivers on that description. In fewer than 90 pages Anomaly addresses chapters on cognitive enhancement, moral enhancement, aesthetic enhancement, immuno-enhancement, and synthetic people.

Anomaly's goal in each chapter is to "give a sense of the reasons for and against a particular kind of enhancement, to explain the kinds of collective action problems that access to enhancement technology might generate, and to think through what we should do in response" (x). A distinctive characteristic of Anomaly's approach is that he hopes to raise moral questions "that are informed by science and constrained by feasibility considerations of the kind economists appeal to" (x). Anomaly has an admirable command of the technological advances being made with enhancing technologies and he addresses the ethical complexity of these developments with competence and insight.

Advancing normative discussion and debates, let alone some practical prescriptions, about technological interventions that are still speculative (and may or may not come to fruition) is a daunting and challenging endeavour. Intellectual humility and an adaptive and provisional moral lens are, I believe, the foundational ingredients to a sage analysis of potential enhancing technologies. Anomaly's goal of advancing arguments and analyses informed by the science is a welcome contribution to these debates in bioethics, though the science surrounding each of these enhancement issues is still very contested and embryonic (as opposed to settled) and thus each individual chapter of this short book could be the focus of a book in itself.

Regarding cognitive enhancement, the focus of Chapter 1, the issue of what constitutes "intelligence" is a topic of much debate among scientists, as is the issue of the role of heritability for intelligence. The nature of the fast-paced analysis Anomaly deploys in this book means that the definition and heritability of intelligence are addressed in just three pages. The risk is that a reader might form an overly simplistic understanding of the science, for example, interpreting the claim that "genetics explains about 80 percent of the variation in intelligence between adults in a population" (5) to imply that society ought to prioritize equalizing the genetics for intelligence rather than focusing so much on education and supportive family environments. But from childhood through to young adulthood environment plays a more significant role in differences in intelligence. And there are additional complexities, like the fact that the environments people are exposed to in the actual world do not always mirror the "normal range of environmental influence" to which genome-wide association studies refer. So the role neglect and abuse play in differentials in intelligence is a further complication which illustrates the limits of relying solely on genome-wide polygenic scores that aggregate the effects of thousands of genetic variants. My point is a simple one: I think this area of scientific inquiry is still too early and ongoing to make formulating any specific normative prescriptions plausible and defensible.

Anomaly covers a number of interesting topics related to cognitive enhancement, including personality traits (the big 5 (OCEAN): Openness, Conscientiousness, Empathy, Agreeableness, and Neuroticism), positional goods, social benefits, and moral standing and moral status. His examination of cognitive enhancement is insightful and provocative, and effectively demonstrates why this is an issue that should be given serious consideration rather than blindly ignored or cavalierly embraced.

Chapter 2 addresses the issue of moral enhancement, a topic that has been receiving growing attention in bioethics over the past decade. Anomaly begins the chapter by considering the pros and cons of oxytocin, a hormone that plays an important role in social bonding. If particular (modifiable) genes could be identified that could influence how generous and fair our offspring would be, should parents have the liberty to pursue such modifications? Would there be a moral obligation on parents to alter their children so that they make better moral decisions? These are provocative and interesting questions, and students taking an undergraduate bioethics class will find Anomaly's fast-paced exploration of these issues an engaging introduction to these ethical debates.

One of the more original topics in the book is in Chapter 3, which examines "aesthetic enhancement". Assessing Charles Darwin's claim that it was sexual, and not natural, selection pressures that have shaped the origins of beauty, Anomaly addresses issues such as why the height of a male partner is valued by women (e.g., it functioned as a proxy for physical abilities related to hunting and fighting off aggressors), or (for both sexes) the facial symmetry of a potential partner (which may signal low oxidative stress or low parasite load).

The standards of beauty in any given culture is of course a complex issue, covering both biological and cultural factors. It is not possible to delve into the contentious and complex nature of these subjects in the fast-paced primers of the issues canvassed by Anomaly. But he makes a compelling case for thinking that aesthetic enhancement may be collectively self-defeating as it is an aspiration typically pursued to gain a competitive advantage over others who have less of the relevant advantage. Anomaly notes that while there may be reasons to try to prevent an arms race for aesthetic enhancement, "arguments in favour of the freedom to pursue aesthetic enhancement through genetic selection are strong" (47).

These "strong arguments" that Anomaly identifies range from considerations I think are well founded and compelling, to others that I think are somewhat weaker and questionable. On the stronger end is the likely reality that most parents intent on undergoing genetic selection of their offspring would focus on their potential children's physical and mental health and wellbeing rather than superficial traits that are only partly determined by physical beauty. On the more speculative, weaker end of arguments is the claim that genetic enhancements might reduce the health risks and financial costs associated with existing cosmetic surgeries that future people might otherwise pay for. I myself don't think invoking such speculative scenarios constitutes a strong argument, considering the reality that, at least for the foreseeable future, the idea of utilizing aesthetic genetic enhancement to select offspring would impose, at a minimum, the costs and risks associated with undergoing IVF and pre-implantation genetic diagnosis.

Furthermore, there is a difference between the moral stakes involved in existing adults deciding to spend money on and take the risks of cosmetic surgery, and parents purposely seeking to shape the aesthetic appearance of their offspring. A more detailed moral analysis of these issues would involve separating out cases involving the screening of embryos before implantation (i.e., choosing the embryo which indicate the highest potential for aesthetic beauty) from cases involving engineering an embryo via genome editing to increase aesthetic beauty. The risks and potential benefits in these two cases can differ dramatically. Parents that lack the genetic profiles associated with "high aesthetic" potential would stand to gain the most by opting for genome-editing of their offspring rather than merely selecting from among their embryos those with the highest aesthetic potential (as none might score high on that measure). But the potential adverse health risks of genome editing for aesthetic improvements of an embryo would be rife with significant ethical problems. These kinds of nuances in the potential ethical predicaments concerning aesthetic enhancement are not addressed in the chapter.

Chapter 4 turns to issue of healthy people, with the primary focus on immuno-enhancement. This is a very timely topic given the recent COVID-19 pandemic and the race to discover safe and effective vaccines. The topic of enhancement and human health could of course be a book in itself. Addressing the prevalence of chronic diseases (e.g., cancer, heart disease, and stroke), a potential aging intervention, and debates concerning the medical and social models of disability would have made for a more complete survey of the issue of enhancing human health. Despite its some narrow focus, the analysis of immuno-enhancement is interesting and an important aspect of the enhancement debate.

The final chapter is about synthetic people. Synthetic biology, claims Anomaly, "will transform our world by giving us new kinds of foods, allowing us to create new forms of life, and enabling us to transform into a new type of creature" (71). Anomaly considers the case of creating genetic replicas of ourselves, something he thinks many people might wish to pursue as a kind of immortality -- "a kind of survival in the sense that parents can live vicariously through their (genetically related) children" (73). The chapter is wide ranging, addressing reproductive rights and responsibilities, demographic concerns, the reasons why we have children, and whether or not we should stay a single species.

The book covers a significant number of topics and issues at the forefront of debates on the ethics of human enhancement. Given its expansive scope, and short length, it cannot go into the amount of detail needed to do justice to the complexity and nuance of all the moral stakes at issue in the human enhancement debates. Nonetheless it is an ambitious, original and thoughtful contribution to these debates. It does serve as an effective primer on the ethical implications of enhancing technologies.