Justice in Love

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Nicholas Wolterstorff, Justice in Love, Eerdmans, 2011, 284pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780802866158.

Reviewed by Timothy P. Jackson, Emory University


Nicholas Wolterstorff's Justice in Love (2011) is the companion volume to his Justice: Rights and Wrongs (2008), which is a deft and balanced treatment of the language of "rights" and "duties" and of the proper relation of that language to Christian ethics. In Justice: Rights and Wrongs, Wolterstorff drove the final nail in the coffin of the view that talk of "rights" and "mutual respect" is merely a product of the Enlightenment or a form of Christian apostasy. Wolterstorff demonstrated, on the contrary, that rights and reciprocal justice have been crucial to the Christian tradition and are essential to any viable Christian morality. That being the case, readers of his first book on justice would be entirely justified in expecting a similarly fair and insightful treatment of agapic love[1] in the second. But, alas, in one key respect they would be disappointed.

For reasons that still elude me, in Justice in Love Wolterstorff spins "the classical version of modern day agapism" into a gossamer man by equating it with the overheated views of Anders Nygren. Nygren's Agape and Eros (1930-36) notoriously set agapic love at odds with both erotic desire and justice, and Wolterstorff is correct in criticizing this position.[2] The problem is that he tries to tar all "modern day" agapists -- from Søren Kierkegaard to Karl Barth to Paul Ramsey -- with the same brush. He argues that their accounts of agapic love, like Nygren's, must lead them not merely to be neglectful of justice but also actively to perpetrate injustice. This is a misreading. Wolterstorff's critique hits home in some places, but Kierkegaard, Barth, and Ramsey differ significantly among themselves, and Wolterstorff often blurs this fact. Worse, he lumps them together with Nygren's assault on eros and justitia and thus treats them unfairly.

Wolterstorff marshals telling criticisms of "love monism" -- the view that agape is the only virtue -- and his elaborations of the claims of justice are often innovative and credible. In many ways, Justice in Love is a superb text. Nevertheless, it is marred by a fundamental misapprehension. There is no such thing as "classical modern day agapism," as Wolterstorff describes it.

I. Some Representative Passages

Here are some representative passages from Justice in Love:

All the modern day agapists agreed that if one loves someone agapically, one does not treat him as one does because justice requires it, and conversely, if one treats someone as one does because justice requires it, one is not loving him agapically. Loving someone agapically and treating him as one does because justice requires it are conceptually incompatible. Agapic love casts out all thought of justice and injustice. Agapic love is blind and deaf to justice and injustice. (p. 42)

Agapic love is blind to all requirements coming from the side of the recipient. It is in that way spontaneous. But when I seek to treat you justly, I treat you as I do because your worth requires it. (p. 43)

There is another aspect of the nature of forgiveness that Nygren and the other agapists ignore. Notice that one cannot dispense forgiveness indiscriminately hither and yon. I can forgive you only if you have wronged someone, and only for the wrong you did them. (p. 54)

Not only can one not understand oneself as forgiving someone without employing the concepts of rights and wrongs, justice and injustice. One cannot even perform the act of forgiving someone without employing those concepts. (p. 55)

Agapic love perpetrates injustice. (p. 57)

The position of the agapist implies that I am sometimes permitted to do what I ought not to do [perpetrate injustice]; sometimes it is even the case that I should do what I ought not to do. (p. 61)

What can one say in response to these provocative lines? Let me mount a defense of some modern forms of agapism by drawing several important distinctions.

II. Agapic Love as Sometimes Rising above Justice but Never Falling Below It

Compare Wolterstorff's words above with those of Paul Ramsey:

sometimes love does what justice requires and assumes its rules as norms, sometimes love does more than justice requires but never less, and sometimes love acts in a quite different way from what justice alone can enable us to discern to be right. When one's own interests alone are at stake, the Christian governs himself by love and resists not one who is evil. When his neighbor's need and the just order of society are at stake, the Christian still governs himself by love and suffers no injustice to be done nor the order necessary to earthly life to be injured.[3]

Wolterstorff fails to register that not being limited to justice is not the same as being blind and deaf to justice or to violating justice. If modern justice is plausibly defined in terms of rewarding merit, punishing demerit, or keeping contracts, it is quite possible to go beyond these practices without either ignoring them or offending against them. Wolterstorff himself makes the point that, in Jesus' parable of the vineyard (Matt. 20:1-16), the owner commits no injustice: he pays to the early-comers the amount agreed upon, even though he also generously gives the late-comers an equal sum (p. 60). This important point is devastating against Nygren, but not against Ramsey.

Wolterstorff marks the crucial contrast between acting in accordance with justice and being motivated by justice (p. 45), and he argues persuasively that an agapist as such may do the former without doing the latter. The main question, nonetheless, is not whether an agapist must be motivated by justice in all circumstances but whether she may be so motivated in some circumstances. One might maintain that, by definition, an agapist who is motivated by justice is, to that extent, not an agapist. But that begs the question of whether agapic love and justice are compatible or even cooperative. For his part, to repeat, Wolterstorff thinks that classical modern agapists must be unconcerned with justice and even actively violate it. Paul Ramsey disagrees, as do many (if not most) contemporary agapists. I myself have contended that concern for distributive, retributive, and procedural justice goes hand-in-hand with agape but that agape has priority over them and often goes beyond them.[4] Hans Urs von Balthasar explicitly ties love to awareness of guilt and thus injustice: "the spirit of love cannot teach man the meaning of the Cross, without laying bare the guilt of the world."[5] He is convinced that "love alone can fulfill the law," but, rather than ignoring or contravening justice, he relates it to love: "the Church's proclamation of the principles of social justice, and any efforts she may make to realize them, must be steeped in the love of the New Testament."[6] Was von Balthasar not a classical modern day agapist?

Wolterstorff rightly returns contemporary Christian ethics to the teachings of Jesus and Saint Paul. But modern day agapists have not been as forgetful of how those teachings intimately connect love and justice as Wolterstorff claims. Building on Scripture and Paul Ramsey, I have argued for many years that justice is an indispensable ally of love.[7]Martin Luther King, Jr. comes to mind as explicitly and actively tying love to the combating of injustice: "Love, agape, is the only cement that can hold this broken community together. When I am commanded to love, I am commanded to restore community, to resist injustice, and to meet the needs of my brothers."[8] Was King not a classical modern day agapist?

Wolterstorff's own version of agapism ultimately "incorporates" (p. 72) justitia into agape: "doing justice is an example of love" (p. 84). Biblical teachings do not simply identify love and justice, however. Jesus himself praises agapic love foremost -- his final love command is "love [agapao] one another as I have loved you" (John 15:12) -- but he also sanctions the demands of justice, honesty, humility, and piety. The parable of the vineyard reconciles contractual justice and "generosity" (Matt. 20:1-16), as Wolterstorff recognizes, but it also distinguishes them. Jesus was no love monist who imprudently reduced ethics to fairness-blind benevolence: think of his indictment of the scribes and Pharisees as "hypocrites" for neglecting "the weightier matters of the law: justice and mercy and faith" (Matt. 23:23). (Note that "justice" (krisis) and "mercy" (eleos) are mentioned serially, not conflated.)

III. The Case of Reinhold Niebuhr

Interestingly, Wolterstorff considers Reinhold Niebuhr a "non-classical" agapist. "Classical modern day agapists" hold that one must love one's neighbor agapically "under all conditions," Wolterstorff writes, but Niebuhr allows that "there are conditions under which one should treat one's neighbor as justice requires rather than loving him agapically" (p. 25). In spite of his noting some of the complexities of Niebuhr's position, here again Wolterstorff overstates the case. He accents Niebuhr's conceding the impossibility of Christian love, at least on the group level, and construes him as saying that we must simply leave agape behind as a political ideal, favoring justice instead. Otherwise, agape will "perpetrate injustice or invite victimization" (p. 63). Yet this reading misses Niebuhr's exquisite, sometimes tortured ambivalence. Admittedly, Niebuhr is not always consistent. InMoral Man and Immoral Society, for example, he writes:

A rational ethic aims at justice, and a religious ethic makes love the ideal. A rational ethic seeks to bring the needs of others into equal consideration with those of the self. The religious ethic . . . insists that the needs of the neighbor shall be met, without a careful computation of relative needs.[9]

Given his frequent claims that agape is nonresisting while politics is built on the balance of power, it is tempting indeed to ascribe to Niebuhr a sharp (almost cynical) discontinuity between love and justice, Christianity and politics; but this too easily resolves the central paradox of prophetic morality. The Kingdom is "both here and not yet."

Reminiscent of Kierkegaard's pseudonyms, Niebuhr's character­istic trope is to resist all reductive gambits and to depict Christianity paradoxically. The law of love, for example, is both a cogent norm and an impractical ideal; it is neither simply possible nor simply impossible, but rather an "impossible possibility."[10] A philosophical turn of mind will immediately pounce on this as contradictory, and so it is on one level. Niebuhr's point, however, is that prophetic religion avails itself of myths and mysteries which transcend philosophical reason. Any rationalistic attempt to dismiss the love command as impractical and therefore irrelevant, and any romantic attempt to preach it as fully realizable and therefore straightforwardly binding, evacuates Christian piety of its distinctive tension, according to Niebuhr. "Prophetic Christianity . . . demands the impossible," Niebuhr writes, and yet "the prophetic tradition in Christianity must insist on the relevance of the ideal of love to the moral experience of mankind of every conceivable level."[11] To see in Niebuhr, as does Wolterstorff, a simple or complete disconnect between agapic love and social justice, is to lose Niebuhr's nuance.[12]

IV. Agapic Love as a Duty to the Individual

Wolterstorff contends that agape is unmotivated by the being or doing of the other and is thus a form of "benevolence" or "gratuitous generosity" (p. 42). He recognizes that such love "seeks to promote the good of [the] person as an end in itself" (p. 22), but he is oddly insensitive to the fact that agape earnestly attends to the needs and potentials of the neighbor in all their concreteness. Even if unintentionally, Wolterstorff gives the impression that agapic love, as interpreted by moderns, is a form of optional philanthropy that wells up in the giver utterly arbitrarily and independently of "the recipient." Otherwise, to use his phrase, "the serpent of requirement would have wriggled its way into the garden of pure agape" (p. 45). Wolterstorff surely knows, however, this is not how many modern agapists understand the virtue. For Kierkegaard, agape is "spontaneous" and "unconditional" in not being premised on "worth," defined as achieved merit or demerit, and in not demanding reciprocity. Yet Kierkegaard spends numerous pages in Works of Love (1848) elaborating "our duty to love the people we see."[13] Von Balthasar echoes the sentiment in claiming that "absolute love" is a "duty" that "transcends individual 'inclination'."[14] For both men, agape affirms obligations that are grounded in the reality of God and the neighbor, especially her need for love. Otherwise, it is mere abstract well-wishing, if not self-indulgence -- a kind of moral masturbation.

For many present-day agapists, the "requirements" of charity have a different basis from those of justice; in my estimation, charity looks to sanctity, the image of God borne by all, whereas justice looks to achieved dignity.[15] But charity, including forgiveness of sins, is not simply supererogatory. Justice cannot demand forgiveness as something actively deserved, as Wolterstorff seems to concede (p. 55), but this does not mean that forgiveness is not obligatory and directed toward the other. This realization is very near the heart of Christian ethics: out of gratitude to God and concern for both self and others, forgiveness is required of the victim but cannot be insisted upon by the victimizer. This is precisely why it is a duty of charity and not of justice. If agape and forgiveness were merely supererogatory, Jesus could not have commanded them, Kierkegaard and von Balthasar should not have considered them duties, and Ramsey would not have focused on the "Thou shalts" of Matthew 22.

V. Agapic Love as Equal Regard rather than Identical Treatment

Wolterstorff seems to think that having equal regard for the neighbor must entail treating everyone the same or as close to the same as possible, however unjust this might be.[16]This is not so. Most agapists from Kierkegaard to Ramsey to Gene Outka have recognized that love must respond to the individual in his or her particularity -- feeding the hungry, clothing the naked, giving solace to the grieving, forgiving the guilty, and so on. If one tries to feed the satiated, clothe the well-dressed, comfort the joyful, or forgive the innocent, this will be folly, not charity. Outka has been especially careful to highlight the equal consideration vs. identical treatment distinction,[17] but Wolterstorff mentions his work only in passing. Moreover, Outka takes great pains not to oppose charity and justice, even affirming that "justice may have a limiting effect on agape qua radical other-regard."[18] For him, nothing about agape requires or even permits one to behave unjustly, including giving the prize to the loser in a competition (cf. Wolterstorff, p. 57). Is Outka not a classical modern day agapist?

VI. Agapic Love as Not Unqualified Self-sacrifice

Wolterstorff finds fault with any account of agape that is uncritically self-sacrificial or that vilifies self-love. Unqualified calls for self-sacrifice would inevitably make agapists complicit in tyranny and thus be a threat to justice, as Wolterstorff perceives, even as the failure to respect one's own worth is a kind of moral "malformation" (p. 95). But who, other than Nygren, disagrees with this? Jesus Christ endorses self-love at least eight times in the Gospels, and he prudently escapes the violent crowd when his time had not yet come.[19] He is open to surrendering himself and his legitimate interests, but only under the proper circumstances. Jesus is pre-modern, but many modern feminists have made similar points about the limits of self-sacrifice.[20] In my own work, I have argued that moral self-immolation must be properly motivated (kindness rather than masochism), properly structured (voluntary rather than coerced), and properly effective (productive rather than profligate).[21] I have also contended that "agapic love is antithetical to neither erotic desire nor reasoned justice for oneself or one's friends."[22] Am I not a classical modern day agapist (at least in theory)?

VII. More on Kierkegaard on Love and Justice

Before concluding, let me say more about Kierkegaard and Wolterstorff's appraisal of him. Woterstorff notes that, unlike Nygren, Kierkegaard admitted the legitimacy of self-love (p. 25), but Wolterstorff leaves us with the impression that Kierkegaard shared Nygren's blanket rejection of eros and justice. To be sure, Kierkegaard was very wary of preferential affinities, such as eros and philia, and he does refer to agape as "true love." But he repeatedly makes it clear that romantic love and friendship are not inherently evil or somehow antithetical to agape. They are unstable and tend to overweening pride, thus they must be "dethroned," but they have their proper place. As Kierkegaard puts it inWorks of Love,

Love the beloved faithfully and tenderly, but let love for the neighbor be the sanctifying element in your union's covenant with God. Love your friend honestly and devotedly, but let love for the neighbor be what you learn from each other in your friendship's confidential relationship with God![23]

The Christian may very well marry, may very well love his wife, especially in the way he ought to love her, may very well have a friend and love his native land; but yet in all this there must be a basic understanding between himself and God in the essentially Christian, and this is Christianity.[24]

"Christianity through marriage has made erotic love [Elskov] a matter of conscience,"[25] Kierkegaard maintains, and clearly he allows a more positive role for preferential desire than does Nygren.

And what about justice? Wolterstorff rightly observes that Kierkegaard recommends transcending the adversarial calculations of justice. According to Kierkegaard, "justice pleads the cause of its own, divides and assigns, determines what each can lawfully call his own, judges and punishes if anyone refuses to make any distinction between mine andyours."[26] In contrast, "take away entirely the distinction 'mine' from the distinction 'mine and yours.' What, then, do we have? Then we have the self-sacrificing, the self-denying-in-all-things, the true love."[27] Justice does "shudder" before the revolution of love.[28] It is worth underscoring, nonetheless, that it is the "mine" that is removed from the equation, not the "yours." The Kierkegaardian agapist ignores justice for him or herself, but this might be compatible with championing justice for others. There is more room for this reading than Wolterstorff seems to think, but there is no escaping that the author of Works of Love does not leave it at that.

Kierkegaard goes so far as to aver that "Christianity does not want to make changes in externals; neither does it want to abolish drives or inclination -- it wants only to make infinity's change in the inner being." This sentiment does indeed make social justice impossible, and I wish he hadn't said it. It is not Kierkegaard at his best. This familiar Lutheran dualism is actually a betrayal of his account of "spirit" and "the self" given in The Sickness Unto Death. In that work, any existence that accents one pole of selfhood to the neglect of the other -- soul over body, freedom over necessity, infinitude over finitude -- is a form of "despair" (i.e., sin). Yet the contrast between "internals" and "externals" in the quote from Works of Love reflects precisely this kind of "disrelationship." To think that one can change "the inner being" and leave "externals" alone is to treat the person as if he or she were an angel: disembodied and atemporal. It is to fail to synthesize infinity with finitude. Genuine social justice is inconceivable on such a dualistic basis.

To the extent that Kierkegaard obscures the rights and wrongs of justice, Wolterstorff has a valid case against him. Toward the end of his brief life, however, Kierkegaard himself appears to have seen the light: hence his "Attack on Christendom" (1854-1855). Reportedly, he would sit out in front of a church on Sunday and encourage people not to go in. This is not quite Jesus driving out the money-changers, but even Kierkegaard could not finally leave externals alone. Even the man Wolterstorff considers the father of modern agapism eventually wanted public reformation, as well as private faith, hope, and love.


There is no denying Nicholas Wolterstorff's dialectical skill and historical sophistication. He is a consummate philosopher, deeply versed in and creatively contributing to Christian theory and practice. This makes it all the more surprising that he conjures the bugbear of "classical modern day agapism." One can only speculate on why he takes this tack. The most charitable answer I can offer is that he is so concerned to vindicate justice, as well as to vanquish inappropriate paternalism, that he overcompensates. Wolterstorff's depiction of justice is often compelling, but his characterization of "modern agapism" slips into parody. Some moderns who extol charity virtually equate it with justice (Simone Weil and Joseph Fletcher); at least one puts it directly at odds with justice (Nygren); at least one sees it as entirely unrelated to justice (Kierkegaard); and still others view it as distinct from but symbiotic with justice (Barth, von Balthasar, Martin Luther King, Jr., Ramsey, and Outka). So who are the true "modern agapists"?

Of course, one can stipulate that "modern agapism" is ignorant of and/or antithetical to justice. But this is far too rarified a description. It is, as I say, to construct a gossamer man. If a "straw man" is less morally substantive than one's actual interlocutors, a "gossamer man" is painted as hyper-moral, absurdly oblivious to the real world and its rights and wrongs. Christ-like love, in contrast, gives all neighbors their just due, but it also goes "the extra mile" freely to bestow goodness on those who can benefit from it. Pace Nygren, there should be no conflating Christ's life and teaching with a blithe self-destructiveness or an angelic irresponsibility that is inconsiderate of other virtues, including justice. PaceWolterstorff, this truth has not been lost on all (or even most) modern day agapists.

[1] I use "agape," "agapic love," "charity," "love of neighbor," "Christ-like love," and "Christian love" interchangeably. When I write simply of "love," I have agape in mind.

[2] Wolterstorff also defends Nygren after a fashion, appreciating the "influence" and "systematic rigor" (pp. 21-22) of his claims, even while disagreeing with them.

[3] Ramsey, War and the Christian Conscience (Durham: Duke University Press, 1961), p. 178.

[4] See Jackson, The Priority of Love (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2003).

[5] Von Balthasar, Love Alone: the Way of Revelation (London: Sheed and Ward, 1968), p. 76.

[6] Ibid., p. 105. The title, Love Alone, can make von Balthasar sound like a love monist, but the quote cited illustrates that he endorses both love and justice.

[7] "Love without justice or a love that lapses into injustice is less than loving, but a justice without love or that does not aspire to love becomes less than just"; see The Priority of Love, p. 38.

[8] King, Stride Towards Freedom (New York: Harper and Row, 1958), p. 106.

[9] Niebuhr, Moral Man and Immoral Society (New York: Scribner's, 1960), p. 57.

[10] Ibid., p. 37.

[11] Ibid., pp. 62-63, emphasis added.

[12] These paragraphs on Niebuhr are taken largely from my The Priority of Love, pp. 101-103.

[13] Kierkegaard, Works of Love, trans. by Howard V. and Edna H. Hong (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995), pp. 154-174, emphasis added.

[14] Love Alone: the Way of Revelation, p. 97, emphasis added.

[15] See Jackson, "The Image of God and the Soul of Humanity: Reflections on Dignity, Sanctity, and Democracy," in Religion in the Liberal Polity, ed. by Terence Cuneo (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 2005), pp. 43-73; see also The Priority of Love, esp. p. 211.

[16] See his imaginative discussion of the judges of the Gilmore Award (p. 57):

as convinced agapists of the classical modern day sort, they treat the good of these two [competitors] with equal regard. So they give the honor and money to the loser in the competition. . . . this comes as close to treating them with equal regard as is possible in the situation. But the winner would then be wronged.

[17] See Outka, Agape: An Ethical Analysis (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1972), p. 20.

[18] Ibid., p. 301.

[19] I discuss Jesus and self-love at some length in Love Disconsoled: Meditations on Christian Charity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), esp. Chs. 1 and 3.

[20] See, for instance, Barbara Hilkert Andolsen, "Agape in Feminist Ethics," in Feminist Theological Ethics, ed. by Lois K. Daly (Louisville: Westminster John Knox press, 1994), pp. 146-159.

[21] The Priority of Love, pp. 21-27.

[22] Love Disconsoled, p. 55.

[23] Works of Love, p. 62.

[24] Ibid., p. 145.

[25] Ibid., p. 139.

[26] Ibid., p. 265.

[27] Ibid., pp. 267-268.

[28] Ibid., p. 266.