Judaism and Enlightenment

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Sutcliffe, Adam, Judaism and Enlightenment, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 329pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521820154.

Reviewed by Steven Nadler , University of Wisconsin, Madison


What is to be done about the Jews? This, of course, is the great question faced by all Western societies from late antiquity onwards. Sometimes, as during certain periods in the Middle Ages, the answer was a relatively simple one, involving expulsion and/or violence. But the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries were, in some nations at least, supposed to be an “age of reason”. Despite the fact that, at the beginning of this period, Jews were still officially banned from several domains (including France and England), there was a great deal of sophistication in both official and unofficial attitudes towards Jews and Judaism in early modern Europe.

Just how sophisticated — and complicated — they were is made abundantly and eloquently clear in this fascinating book. Adam Sutcliffe’s subject is not just the obvious one of the legacy of the Enlightenment for the Jews, that is, what the toleration, secularism and rationalism of the Enlightenment held in store for Jewish emancipation, and how these principles lived in tension with the animus against Jews and Judaism by leading thinkers of the time (such as Voltaire). Rather, Sutcliffe wants to show just how “throughout the Enlightenment the question of the status of Judaism and of Jews was a key site of intellectual contestation, confusion and debate” (5). Indeed, he insists, “the complexities clustered around Judaism are of central importance for a general understanding of the Enlightenment itself” (6). Judaism for Sutcliffe becomes a kind of lens through which we can see deeply into Enlightenment thinking, and especially some essential ambiguities and tensions within it.

Sutcliffe is interested not only in intellectual, political and religious attitudes toward the Jews and philosophical reflections on Judaism (such as those we find in Toland, Locke and Bayle), but also in Jewish stimuli for Enlightenment polemics and even Jewish sources for Enlightenment modes of thought, including those modes that were hostile to Judaism. He examines what the Jewish problem — the question of how “Jewish difference” is to be accommodated in modern society, with its non-denominational universalism — meant for the Enlightenment, and how the tools for dealing with that problem sometimes came from within the Jewish milieu itself. It is a rich and complex story, one that Sutcliffe tells with great style, if not always with sufficient philosophical depth and detail. Above all, he offers a clear analysis of the ways in which Judaism, Jewish figures and Jewish writings — especially Hebrew Scripture, Spinoza and kabbalah, but also (astonishingly) Jewish anti-Christian polemics — provoked ambivalent and contradictory responses — alarm, perplexity, intrigue, assimilation — from Enlightenment thinkers.

Much of what Sutcliffe presents will not be new to readers of two other, landmark studies. His discussion of Hebraism in Christian academic circles in the seventeenth-century is familiar from Aaron Katchen’s 1984 study, Christian Hebraists and Dutch Rabbis, while his inquiry into the role played by Spinoza and his circle in the development of the Enlightenment echoes elements of Jonathan Israel’s magisterial Radical Enlightenment (2001). Where Sutcliffe goes beyond Israel’s work is in his claim that not only did certain heterodox Jewish figures play an influential role in the genesis of a radical stream in the Enlightenment, but Judaism itself — its history, its texts, its status — was “inescapably of special significance in the formation of Enlightenment rationalism” (181).

Sutcliffe begins his investigation with the Hebraism to be found in scholarly and religious milieux, especially in the Netherlands of the early seventeenth-century. It was not an unadulterated “philosemitism” — in fact, Sutcliffe explicitly declines to use the terms ’philosemitism’ and ’antisemitism’ to frame the terms of his discussion — but rather a profound interest in the texts, languages, culture and history of the ancient Hebrews, sometimes from academic motives, often as preparation for anti-Jewish polemics. The reader is introduced here to tensions that reappear later in Sutcliffe’s account, between, on the one hand, fascination for and use of res Judaica, and, on the other hand, antipathy toward and fear of Jews and Judaism. The same individuals who had a scholarly and sometimes even a religious respect for Jewish sources also believed in the obsolescence of Judaism itself.

For readers coming from philosophy and its history, the real interest of this book lies in Sutcliffe’s analysis of the role played by the Jewish material in the rise of Enlightenment rationalism. As we know from Israel’s study, the real culprit here is Spinoza, as well as the city of Amsterdam itself and the Portuguese-Jewish community that thrived in its cosmopolitan and relatively tolerant environment. Sutcliffe argues that Jewish Amsterdam was practically a breeding ground of the radical Enlightenment. Its cross-fertilizations of Protestant, Catholic and Jewish cultures and Dutch and Iberian sensibilities “touched the entire community and influenced the outlook of its leadership”, as well as its many members, with the result that it nourished “the minds of those isolated radicals who most insistently explored the intersection between those worlds” (112). Sephardic Amsterdam, with heterodox thinkers such as Da Costa, Prado and Spinoza, was a “crucible of theological dissent … [that] contributed to the ideas and arguments of the wider European Enlightenment, as it gathered force in the closing decades of the seventeenth-century” (117).

What the Enlightenment radicals found in Spinoza, above all, was a serious, knowledgeable de-sacralizing critique of Scripture, one that reduced it to a work of human literature. Spinoza’s Theological-Political Treatise gave them the tools they needed to undermine the claims of organized religion, and especially the political usurpations being practiced by contemporary ecclesiastics. But there was a problem. These arguments that the radical crowd found so useful came from a Jewish source. Thus, once again, we come across the tension that Sutcliffe finds so essential to the Enlightenment. The same Jewish tradition that needed to be rejected for its particularism — “the epitome of unenlightened superstition and legalism” — and as a threat to the universalist rationalism being promoted by these thinkers, offered the best practical tools for furthering their anti-establishment project. This brings Sutcliffe to one of the more interesting aspects of his story, viz., the way in which the Enlightenment labored to de-Judaize Spinoza and distance him from his Jewish origins. In order to claim Spinoza for itself, radical philosophy had to erase all traces of Jewishness from his identity. Spinoza may have been born and raised a Jew, but Judaism rejected him and he rejected Judaism, with the result that he ended up an atheist, and the period’s most prominent truly secular individual. Spinoza thus becomes to his radical but anti-Judaic acolytes the messiah of rationalism (or, to use Sutcliffe’s phrase, “the Jesus Christ of Reason”). Spinoza is represented in literature of the time “as something almost miraculous: a Jew who has utterly transcended the mark of his origin” (139). He gave early Enlightenment radicals messianic hope that a universalistic reign of reason was close at hand. “The dawn of Enlightenment is thus given a subliminally millenarian tinge, with Spinoza performing the key Messianic role as its necessarily originally, and then no longer, Jewish harbinger” (140).

Part of Sutcliffe’s argument on the role that Spinoza played in the genesis of the radical Enlightenment depends on what seems to be a somewhat questionable reading of Spinoza. Sutcliffe’s Spinoza is a thinker still sentimentally beholden to his Jewish roots. While Sutcliffe takes note of Spinoza’s denigration of and “profound hostility” towards “formal Judaism”, especially as an “unphilosophical” religion, his portrayal of Spinoza is that of someone who is nonetheless respectful, even defensive, about Judaism and its history. True enough, as Sutcliffe notes, “a distinctly Jewish perspective is woven into [Spinoza’s] philosophical arguments”. But Sutcliffe’s Spinoza still retains a sense of Jewish identity and “pride” in Jewish history and culture. “Jewish history was legitimated per se, as the collective memory of his own people” (124). It was not Spinoza, Sutcliffe claims, but only later thinkers (such as Lodewijk Meyer) for whom “Jewish difference … stands as a problem, to be transcended by the imminent triumph of secular reason. In implicitly situating Judaism as antithetical not simply to Christianity but to reason itself, Meyer injected a sharp hint of hostility into the relationship between Judaism and the radical early Enlightenment” (128). But is not this “hostility” already there in Spinoza, the man who insisted that Jews were “emasculated” by their religion? It is hard to read the Theological-Political Treatise and come away with the impression that its author still saw himself as a Jew, much less that he saw Judaism as compatible with progressive, secular reason. Sutcliffe takes a different approach from that of Steven Smith who, in his Spinoza, Liberalism and the Question of Jewish Identity, argues that it was Spinoza himself, and not only his followers, who required the transcending of a particularism that was represented above all by Judaism. Even Sutcliffe, later in the book, allows that Spinoza “unambiguously excludes Judaism from his standards of intellectual tolerability”, and that for him Judaism is “the starkest case of a worldview that does not conform to [the] standards” of rational logic (217-218).

Sutcliffe’s is ultimately a story of decline. In the end, the Enlightenment would turn on the Jews. What was originally, in the mid seventeenth-century, ambivalence and tension among gentile scholars who were engaged in the intense study of rabbinic and other Jewish texts — “eagerly scouring the Jewish tradition for guiding insights into fundamental questions of history, theology, hermeneutics and politics” (247) — and especially in the radical stream of the Enlightenment, becomes, by the early eighteenth-century, only tension, mainly between the moderate wing’s ideal of toleration and the intolerant invective often hurled against Judaism. Voltaire was willing to argue for the toleration of contemporary Jews, but he had nothing but contempt for Judaism itself. His was a rationalistic hostility, Sutcliffe argues, that stemmed not from rhetorical enthusiasm or unfortunate personal relations with particular Jews, as has been suggested, but from what he saw as Judaism’s resistance to fitting into the Enlightenment schema. It is an emblematic attitude. “Voltaire’s persistent hostility towards Judaism in a sense draws into unique focus the problems underlying the general Enlightenment stance towards a minority that appeared profoundly unassimilable to its logic” (233).

On the whole, this book is an outstanding addition to the literature. Like Arthur Hertzberg’s more narrowly focused The French Enlightenment and the Jews(1968), it will be required reading on the Enlightenment and the Jews; and, like Israel’s book, it will constitute an important source for the context and legacy of Spinoza’s thought. Readers, especially those seeking an elaboration of philosophical positions, will be frustrated by the quick pace and large cast of characters and works that Sutcliffe expertly surveys. He is great on sweep, but often short on details. For example, we are not told what exactly is the “purified Judaism” that, for the Dutch radical (and Spinozist) Adriaen Koerbagh, constitutes the “true philosophical religion” (131). But this is a minor complaint. Sutcliffe’s analyses and fluent narrative make for compelling and informative reading, and the picture that emerges throws a good deal of light on a hitherto neglected aspect of this period of intellectual history.