Judith Butler: Live Theory

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Vicki Kirby, Judith Butler: Live Theory, Continuum, 2006, 182pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826462936.

Reviewed by Karen Kachra, Toronto, Canada


Vicki Kirby's presentation of Butler is, like Butler's own critical reading, thoughtful and rigorous, generous yet insubordinate. The level of scholarship here is superior: our author glides skillfully from Hegel to Lacan, Freud to Derrida, Althusser to Foucault, in order to capture the sense and flow of Butler's own arguments. In a slim volume, she succeeds in treating a wealth of complex material. This is partly because her writing is lucid and succinct, but also because she offers a well-structured and judicious selection of Butler's key contributions. Kirby cuts quickly to the crux of Butler's most interesting arguments and then unpacks them with care. Thankfully, hers is an engaged and engaging delivery of Butler's oeuvre-to-date: the reader is witness to a stimulating dialogue between two talented scholars rather than simply presented with a summary of themes. In this spirit, Kirby offers many excellent criticisms of and questions about Butler's ideas that warrant development elsewhere.

Buyer beware, however. For this text is not, as it claims on the cover, an introduction, "guiding the student through" Butler's ideas. In the preface Kirby acknowledges as much, stating that she was not prepared to sacrifice the intricacy of Butler's arguments to render them easily digestible for beginners or indeed, I would venture, for seasoned academics unfamiliar with poststructuralist genres. Do not, then, expect to use this book in an introductory class on gender theory or queer theory. For those not already intimately familiar with Butler's analyses and arguments, a major portion of Kirby's commentary will remain impenetrable. Do expect to find this book helpful if you have already read a good deal of Butler and you are familiar with the sources from which she draws. The inaccessibility of this "introduction" is a pity, for the same reasons that Kirby herself cites regarding the reception of Butler's texts. Too often Butler's ideas have been misunderstood and misrepresented, her work attacked as shoddy pomo evangelism or the complexity of her thought traduced as "bad writing" by readers who are flummoxed by the peculiarities of French Theory.

Judith Butler: Live Theory tracks the chronology of Butler's major publications, beginning with a short chapter devoted to her first book, Subjects of Desire: Hegelian Reflections in France (1987). Here Kirby focuses on Butler's own interpretation of Hegel. What fascinates Butler is the "internal architecture" of displacement that she finds in Hegel: "this sense that we are somehow displaced while remaining bound within something" (3). Butler's interpretation dwells on the productive power of "the negative." In negation, says Kirby, Butler finds "the possibility of regeneration and human freedom" (11). This strategy of seeking the political potential of errancy, instability, failure, gaps, excess and deviation is a key one. As Kirby notes, "locating and understanding what we might call the technology of the negative, this apparently empty space where so much can happen, remains the enduring political objective in Butler's work" (100).

Butler's best-known and most influential work to date is Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity (1990). Written during the heyday of identity politics, it sought to trouble feminist discourses that relied on common identity as a foundation for liberatory politics. Butler targets the defining institutions of phallologocentrism and compulsory heterosexuality. In the book's original preface, a key question emerges: does being female constitute a "natural fact" or is this "naturalness" in fact "constituted through discursively constrained performative acts that produce the body through and within the categories of sex" (xxix)? To some readers, this might seem like a strange set of alternatives. Besides, as Butler herself queries, what does a critical inquiry into the ontology of sexuality and gender have to do with "the task of politics" (xxix)? A welcome addition to Kirby's presentation here would be some discussion of the question of foundations, or grounds, an issue that has consistently commanded Butler's attention. (Consider the way Butler characterizes her project in comparison to her feminist interlocutors, differences that are handily recorded in the published debates Feminist Contentions: a philosophical exchange (1995).) Nevertheless, Kirby offers helpful recapitulations as well as pointed questions about the content of Butler's proposals in Gender Trouble as she draws us through each twist and turn of the book.

Kirby then sensibly spends two chapters discussing Butler's next major publication, Bodies That Matter: On the Discursive Limits of "Sex" (1993). In many ways this is the richest and most difficult of Butler's works. It is here that she begins to really grapple with what it might mean for bodies to materialize, or be produced, in sex- and gender-specific forms. She also theorizes the production of the category of "sex." As Kirby interprets it, Bodies That Matter "insist[s] that cultural processes generate natural foundations" (48). What exactly does this amount to?  For the moment let me simply flag that a good deal of the discussion here is delivered in psychoanalytic terms. Kirby takes us, following Butler, through Freud, then Lacan, and then into the Lacanian/Hegelian theory of Slavoj Žižek.

She foregoes a discussion of Butler's Althusser until the following chapter. It is devoted to Excitable Speech: a Politics of the Performative. Kirby calls this project "a more detailed account of how the constitutive and materializing process of language actually works" (87). Once again we find Butler sampling from several different theoretical approaches. Besides employing Althusser's scenario of "interpellation", she invokes Austin's "perlocutionary" speech act, Derrida's concept of "iterability" and Foucault's "discursive formation." Kirby takes it that Butler concerns herself with the category of hate speech and its treatment in the courts in order to procure concrete examples for her performativity theory. The analysis of hate speech is geared to show that her theory has "pragmatic purchase" (98). The text can also, of course, be considered a political intervention. So why weigh in on hate speech, in particular? It seems to me that hate speech emerges as Butler's hard case. If the subject is produced by the ways she is recognized through speech acts -- on one formulation "it is by being interpellated within the terms of language that a certain social existence of the body first becomes possible" (ES 5) -- then what about subjects who are recognized first and foremost through injurious terms, terms that wound and debilitate? Butler wants to locate and account for the "discursive agency" that such "victims" routinely exercise through their own speech.

A more general form of this anti-foundationalist problematic, the problem of agency, is presented at the outset of Kirby's next chapter concerning The Psychic Life of Power: Theories in Subjection (1997). On behalf of many of Butler's critics, Kirby asks "what happens to the subject if there is no outside of power?" (110). Although Kirby does not quite connect these dots, her citations reveal that Butler turns to power's "psychic life" precisely because it is the arena where power's subjectivating force seems most likely to be interrupted or disrupted in some fashion. Butler thus sets her task in this later work to bring psychoanalytic theories of prohibition (identity-formation) into conversation with Nietzsche and Foucault's notion of the productivity of modern power. Kirby concentrates her analysis on Butler's third chapter, "Subjection, Resistance, Resignification: between Freud and Foucault," stating that it "offers an instructive representation of what Butler is trying to achieve" (112).

Kirby rounds out her exploration of Butler with two less involved chapters. The first sets out to consider other scholars who have entered into conversation with Butler. Yet this body of scholarship is now so immense that Kirby's gesture to include Nancy Fraser and Slavoj Žižek, while of some interest, ultimately comes off as flimsy. Likewise does the final chapter, the transcript of an interview of Butler by Kirby. Compared to the involved analyses and challenging criticisms just presented to us, nothing new or very memorable is revealed by Kirby's understandably polite probing of her subject. Perhaps the most satisfying nugget occurs when Butler briefly reflects on her character: she feels she is "one of those people who is always trying to figure out how to live" (157).

Let me turn now to three interrelated and mutually supporting criticisms -- picture them as the sides of a triangle -- that Kirby poses to Butler's theory.

One line of criticism concerns Butler's portrayal of power. Kirby argues that despite Butler's commitment to conceive power as a generative force she (often) winds up invoking a notion of power as repressive and constraining. Butler writes of the power to name, for example, as a power that assigns and delimits, so that the very act of naming is considered a kind of violence, argues Kirby (77). For Butler, power is productive only insofar as it is restrictive; unlike Foucault, she considers only the generative effects of a power that works in essentially constraining ways (114). "This reversion to a juridical notion of power whose intricacies, when all is said and done, are reducible to control is certainly curious," writes Kirby, "because Butler is obviously wanting to conjure something else" (41). In part, Butler's lapses are owing to her profound reliance on psychoanalytic theory, which makes the notion of prohibition central to psycho-social development (46). In part, it is because Butler conceives of the body as a surface to which cultural norms are applied (61). Butler seems to see the body as a shifting text, or discursive effect (69). Finally, although Butler's understanding of norms and the process of normalization has changed somewhat (122-128), for the most part normative power has been equated with constraint and norms likened to ideal standards. Kirby, then, poses the obvious question: why must we assume that power's primary "intention" is to control and sublimate the pre-discursive mind/body?

Indeed, if we do construe power negatively, according to a model of constraint, we soon arrive at another problem, and Kirby's second major objection. Namely, that a surreptitious foundationalism is at play in the way that Butler relates the natural to the cultural. Kirby develops the argument that Butler, again despite her avowed intentions, reinstalls old hierarchies between matter and ideality, nature and culture, body and mind.

[S]he shows that what we thought was Nature is really "nature", that is, Culture. However, we need to appreciate here that Butler has actually drawn a line of clarification between a realm of knowledge and political contestation, namely Culture, and what pre-exists it -- Nature (now more accurately represented as "under erasure", or crossed out --Nature). Thus Butler's critique of the inseparability and contamination of nature and culture as concepts is founded upon an absolute separation between matter/Nature [crossed out] and culture/ideality. (69)

Kirby further proposes that the way Butler conceives of signs -- as cultural additions or inscriptions onto bodies -- draws her into a position akin to Cartesian dualism. "Butler's thesis must refuse any suggestion that biological substance might be semiological in nature. Instead, … Butler draws a dividing line between Nature (the unknown, the "before thought" and language) and Culture (the known, the thought, the articulated) on the surface of the skin" (83).

Butler is obviously attuned to the shortcomings of an inscriptionist depiction of cultural construction. Unfortunately, Kirby does not comment on Butler's decisions in Bodies that Matter as well as in The Psychic Life of Power to invoke Aristotle at crucial junctures in sorting through the relationship of form to matter. In her evolving interpretation of Foucault, Butler strays from inscription language and begins to also describe subjection in terms of training, shaping, cultivation and investment (PP 90). She is careful to point out that the "schema" of the soul cum prison should not be conceived of as pre-existing the body/matter/subject which it materializes: "the body … is not an independent materiality, a static surface or site, which a subsequent investment comes to mark, signify upon, or pervade" (PP 91). However, Kirby's position is that there is a tension in Butler's work, one that we might expediently mark as the incompatibility of Foucault with Freud/Lacan. Whereas Butler tries to work somewhere "in between" these two legacies, Kirby and I would continue to raise doubts about the viability and sensibility of such a middle-ground.

Finally, Kirby challenges Butler's theory as regards the conception of identity/difference at work in her texts. Butler invests in a very conventional notion of the sign's identity, proposes Kirby, which compels her to "read difference against identity, presence against absence, and to reiterate the conservative implication of this signifying economy" (74). For instance, Butler follows a Lacanian interpretation of signification in which "the bar of prohibition" separates Real from Symbolic. In Bodies that Matter, Butler does argue that the Real is produced within the domain of language/culture. However the trouble, contends Kirby, is that the bar itself is not interrogated as a cultural artifact.

Butler's faith in the conceptual topography of the sign and its expression through presence and absence must inevitably hit up against a difference deemed to be absolutely exterior to culture/language, even though it is produced within it. In sum then, Butler's interrogation of the bar and its abjecting results relocates the cut of prohibition rather than calling foreclosure and absence itself into question. (75)

Hence, Kirby would seem to agree with Žižek rejoinder to Butler (142): that it is really Butler who, on a more radical level, is not historicist enough, for she construes "passionate attachment" as an architectural feature of subjectivity rather than a relationship which is itself riven by difference.

In this vein, Kirby suggests that Butler fails to fully appreciate Derrida's nuanced understanding of difference. On Kirby's reading, Butler seeks political possibility in the discrepancies generated between language and the actuality of the referent (79). The mind/body inevitably exceeds the categories it is supposed to approximate, hence the category of "woman" can never be truly descriptive of a class of bodies. This, Kirby points out, is to promote a logic of identity that treats difference as lack. It is a logic which is called into question by the Derridean notion of différance, however. Roughly put, there is no departure, in time, from an original sameness; rather, the "origin"'s integrity is always already fraught with possibilities. If difference inheres within identity then it cannot be conceived of as a mark of identity's deficiency, though this latter view is precisely the unsupportable "primordial sense of identity and desire" that Kirby believes Butler is ultimately and unfortunately drawn to. She is drawn to it because she is sensitive to the so-called "failure" of culture (variously construed as norms, power, language) to "fix" subjects according to (supposed) hegemonic purposes. In what is ultimately a rather heartwarming and inspiring stance, Butler turns to perversion, abjection and "failure" to seek the promise of political revolution and radical social change.

Whatever their shortcomings, Butler's texts have proven powerfully evocative. Fecund enough to spawn whole sub-disciplines of theory, they have impelled scholars to scrutinize the politics inherent in their theoretical commitments and incited activists to grapple with obstruse French texts. Hers are words to come back to. It is a treat to have Kirby as a guide in this recent contribution to Continuum's Live Theory series.