Just Caring: Health Care Rationing and Democratic Deliberation

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Leonard M. Fleck, Just Caring: Health Care Rationing and Democratic Deliberation, Oxford UP, 2009, 460pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195128048.

Reviewed by Norman Daniels, Harvard School of Public Health



How should we decide what kinds of health care services we should provide each other as a matter of justice in a caring society? We must answer this key question since there are limits to what we can afford to provide each other even in wealthy societies. The question is particularly difficult to answer since reasonable people may disagree about what they think we owe each other as a matter of justice. The difficulty of answering the question is brought out in the many well-chosen examples Leonard Fleck develops for the reader throughout the book, Just Caring.

Fleck’s thoughtful effort to address this key question is a welcome antidote to the way in which “rationing” was treated as a dirty word in the effort to scuttle U.S. health reform in 2009-10. Indeed, opponents of insurance reform actually lied to the American public: they said the proposed reform legislation set up “death panels,” when all it did was pay clinicians to discuss end of life care with patients. These tactics so scared proponents of reform that they prohibited research comparing the effectiveness of different treatments (which is funded as part of the reform) from being used to make decisions about the coverage of services. Opponents of reform arguably set back public understanding of rationing or limit-setting, perhaps by decades, cultivating the illusion that private insurers can be trusted to make appropriate decisions about coverage while government bureaucrats have to be kept away. In contrast, Fleck, whose book predates the reform debate, argues that only broad and inclusive democratic deliberation about these issues can yield legitimate and fair outcomes.

The first five chapters of Just Caring develop Fleck’s account of how we should answer the key question, namely through a form of democratic deliberation, and I shall concentrate on that account in what follows. The remaining nine chapters address more specific issues in light of his answer to the key question. Some of those chapters focus on specific technologies: what should we do about costly but effective technologies, such as improved artificial hearts? What should we do about last-chance therapies? When have we provided enough assistance to people in need of organ transplantation? Other chapters focus on problems about how we should treat different groups: Can we avoid discriminating against people with disabilities? Should we ever ration by age? Do possible children have a just claim to have a healthy genome? Yet other chapters raise more general questions: what does liberalism require in our decisions about services? What special issues are raised by public health interventions? What is fair financing? In the chapter on fair financing, Fleck argues for a single-payer system, in effect challenging central features of the recent U.S. reform before it was enacted.

Despite the difficult and interesting issues discussed in these last nine chapters, the heart of Fleck’s approach is his argument that we must answer the key question through a form of democratic deliberation. A central feature of that view is its claim that decision-making about rationing or limits to health care must be done publicly. This would mark a sharp break with American practice. Decades ago, Fleck criticized the “invisible rationing” (indeed, he may have introduced the term) that pervades the U.S. system, anticipating and critiquing the confusing rhetoric (noted earlier) that attacks government bureaucrats for rationing while leaving private insurers off the hook.

In Just Caring this critique is elaborated to establish a key premise of his account: rationing is both pervasive and unavoidable, a feature of all health systems that is most often hidden from sight so that we cannot examine the rationales for the particular limits it imposes. The claim that it is unavoidable rests on the contention that new technologies — which we strive to develop - make the concept of need expansive. That is, we now can provide interventions for conditions that we could do nothing about before, and so we create new, expanding needs for those specific interventions; as a result, people can make claims to have them provided. The idea that rationing is pervasive rests on the observation that our earlier recognition of one claim, for example to provide people with dialysis if they have kidney failure, gives support to others, for example, for antiretroviral treatment for HIV/AIDS or for transplantation of organs other than kidneys. Because we were willing to fund an emerging technology in the past when there were few such technologies and we were able to afford it, we give weight to comparable claims that others can make now for emerging technologies, even though we now have a problem affording their combined cost. Both public and private insurance systems have incentives to cut costs by reducing access to services, though they also have motivation not to be seen as limiting access - consequently, much rationing is invisible, even as it is pervasive and unavoidable.

But making rationing invisible does not make our rationing decisions just; it only hides them, and that is itself unjust. Instead, we should publicly scrutinize and deliberate about our rationing decisions. Here we face a difficult problem: specifying a fair, deliberative process that can address reasonable disagreement among its participants. Consider the problem of disagreement first: people will disagree about what they think they owe each other by way of health care. In addition, we lack consensus on principles that tell us exactly how to resolve those disputes about rationing. Fleck refers to these as “interstitial” matters of justice — they are not fully resolved, even if they are constrained, by broader concerns of justice for health.1 Fleck refers to these broader concerns as “constitutional” principles of justice for health. For example, Fleck argues that one such constitutional principle is that decisions about health care should aim at protecting fair equality of opportunity — what people can do or be depends in part on their levels of functioning and thus on their health. A rationing decision made through a democratic, deliberative process must respect (not violate) this constitutional principle. At the same time, such a principle cannot tell us exactly how to ration health care, since there are different ways in which coverage decisions protect opportunity. Fleck thus agrees with Daniels’s (1985) support of a fair equality of opportunity principle as a principle of justice for health and health care, but also with Daniels’s (1993), and later Daniels and Sabin’s (1997, 2002), insistence that the equal opportunity principle cannot answer key questions about rationing and needs to be supplemented by a fair, deliberative process. Daniels and Sabin, however, disagree with Fleck about what kind of democratic deliberative process is needed.

Fleck’s appeal to a democratic deliberative process to address our lack of substantive principles that can answer our questions about rationing can be viewed as an appeal to a special form of procedural justice. In Rawls’s (1971) classic discussion of procedural justice, he distinguishes pure from impure procedural justice. In impure procedural justice, we have prior agreement on a principle but need a process to assure us the principle is applied properly. Thus in a criminal trial, we agree we should convict all and only the guilty and we develop adversarial techniques in our trial process to help assure us that we do not err in our decisions. Of course, we sometimes err, so a criminal trial is only an imperfect form of impure procedural justice. Rawls suggests gambling is a clear paradigm of pure procedural justice: an outcome is fair if it is the result of a spin of a balanced roulette wheel, the toss of a balanced die, or play of an unmarked deck of cards. Gambling, however, is not constrained by other principles of justice, as democratic deliberation about rationing is. Nor can we imagine developing arguments that persuade us that the toss of a balanced die did not produce a fair outcome, yet we can imagine defeating a rationing decision by developing a persuasive argument, for example, that we should aggregate benefits in one way rather than another. So appealing to democratic deliberation as a form of procedural justice differs in two ways from Rawls’s example of pure procedural justice.

Fleck should view the outcome of a democratic deliberative process as defeasible in this way, for he cannot rule out our coming to accept such an argument. Does he? I think it is not clear. He seems to offer additional constraints on the democratic deliberative process that aim to assure us the outcome of such a process is just, and not merely defeasibly just. One of the additional constraints, besides the constitutional principles noted earlier, is the view that a democratic deliberative decision must cohere with our other judgments about rationing in (wide) reflective equilibrium. But being in wide reflective equilibrium is something that can change with new considerations, such as the argument about aggregation we are imagining might be developed, and so that constraint also leaves the door open to defeasibility. It is less clear what Fleck means when he says that the decisions must rest on grounds that participants cannot reasonably reject, apparently echoing Scanlon (1998). Can something be a claim we cannot reasonably reject at one time but can come to reject reasonably later? Perhaps, but we need a clarification of the constraint. More than that, we might hope for a clearer discussion of how these different constraints work together and what they really assure us about.

Fleck appeals to the need for a democratic deliberation that includes all people potentially affected by the decision. His main rationale for the democratic deliberative process seems to be that only such an inclusive event would generate general consent to the rationing it approves, and only such consent by all potentially affected by the rationing legitimizes the decision. It is not clear, however, why the deliberative democratic process cannot be one that society delegates (democratically) to some group of decision-makers. Fleck should provide some argument why we need a direct, democratic deliberative polling of all those (potentially) affected, rather than allow a properly constituted and selected (perhaps representative) group to make the decision on behalf of society. Of course, there are real worries about procedures of selection and how they may be captured, but without some form of delegation, Fleck seems to be requiring a form of full participation in a democratic deliberation, and this raises issues about the practicality of the proposal. Fleck all along says he is aiming at a practically and not simply theoretically defensible approach to rationing, but requiring that all decisions about rationing be made through this comprehensive polling process seems to be the height of impracticality. It seems even more impractical when one realizes that coverage decisions made in this way must be revisited in light of new health care developments or evidence about them, so that the process is an ongoing one, never fully completed. That would seem to put enormous time demands on the participants in the polling process.

The process seems impractical in another way. Fleck appeals to Rawls’s distinction between public reason and reasoning that allows appeal to comprehensive moral, religious, or philosophical views that might not be shared by all. Rawls insisted that we restrict ourselves to public reason in deliberating about basic matters of justice and constitutional essentials. It is hardly clear that the “interstitial” matters of justice that Fleck addresses fit cleanly into the domain that Rawls wanted to restrict to public reason. It will be very difficult to insist that people restrict their claims about what health services we owe each other to views that do not in any way appeal to comprehensive views that are not part of an “overlapping consensus.” In addition, Fleck does not say how a democratic deliberation is to address persistent disagreement — something made even more likely if we cannot exclude all appeals to comprehensive views. Perhaps Fleck thinks that the requirement that we focus on reasons people cannot reasonably reject will eliminate disagreement, but then that proviso carries much more theoretical weight than his discussion of it suggests.

Two other worries about Fleck’s appeal to democratic deliberative polling need to be mentioned. Fleck says nothing about how one translates the results of such polling into actual policy or clinical practice. What gives the polling regulative authority? And how is that authority asserted in the face of push-back from patients or clinicians? What if standard democratic political institutions — the courts, the legislature — push back against specific decisions? What democratic authority do we ultimately recognize? Finally, if there is such value to democratic deliberative polling, then why not extend the practice beyond health care to other policies that raise central questions about justice — education, job creation, health and safety regulation, and many other policies now firmly left in the political arena (for better or worse)? Fleck owes us some discussion of why we should or should not extend his proposal to other domains.

I noted in the opening paragraph that Fleck has populated the book with a host of rich, well-developed examples. Despite the various worries I have raised about Fleck’s version of democratic deliberation, the mix of examples and theory constitute a great strength of the book. The examples make it clear that these are difficult issues, and that various considerations pull us in different directions regarding them. It is not surprising that reasonable people will disagree about what to do and that some form of democratic deliberation about them is needed. At the same time, the examples demand action - we either make these services available or we do not. One of the most important lessons we can draw from Fleck’s discussion of these cases is that our inclination to meet people’s needs pushes us toward an unsustainable policy, just as our inclination to think we need limits makes us realize we have no simple answers about how to set them. This lesson reminds us how unconstructive, indeed destructive, the dogmatic rhetoric about death panels and rationing has been in the course of the debate about U.S. health reform.


Daniels, N. 1985: Just Health Care. New York: Cambridge University Press.

- - - . 1993: ‘Rationing Fairly: Programmatic Considerations’, Bioethics 7/2-3: 224-233.

Daniels, N. and J. Sabin. 1997: ‘Limits to Health Care: Fair Procedures, Democratic Deliberation, and the Legitimacy Problem for Insurers’, Philosophy and Public Affairs 26: 303-50.

- - . 2002: Setting Limits Fairly: Can We Learn to Share Medical Resources? New York: Oxford University Press.

Rawls, J. 1971: A Theory of Justice. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Scanlon, T. 1998: What Do We Owe to Each Other? Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.

1 In a somewhat idiosyncratic terminology, he also says these are “non-ideal” issues of justice, meaning that general conformance with the constitutional principles does not determine what to do about these issues; more commonly, “non-ideal” would refer to situations where we lack general conformance with broader principles of justice.