Just Health: Meeting Health Needs Fairly

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Norman Daniels, Just Health: Meeting Health Needs Fairly, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 397pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521699983.

Reviewed by Søren Holm, Cardiff Law School, Cardiff University


This book represents the synthesis and mature formulation of Norman Daniels' work on issues in justice in health over the last more than 30 years. It extends and revises the framework Daniels has developed in previous work such as the books Just Health Care, Am I My Parents' Keeper? and Setting Limits Fairly.

The basic ideas in Daniels' framework have not changed. He still bases his analyses on Rawls' difference principle and the extension of this to the health care field that he developed in Just Health Care, focusing on health as a necessary factor for equality of opportunity. His overall methodology is still a search for wide reflective equilibrium.

Between Just Health Care and the current book Just Health three major shifts have occurred. The first is a partial shift in focus from the distribution of health care as the major concern to a much broader view of the social determinants of health as the proper object for our consideration of justice in the health context. Daniels has always realised that there is more to health than health care. Already in Just Health Care published in 1985 he made the point that: "Care is not equivalent to prevention. Some disease will not be detected in time for it to be cured. Some is not curable, even if it is preventable, and treatments will vary in efficacy. We protect equal opportunity best by reducing and equalizing the risk of these conditions arising." (Daniels 1985, p. 141) Nevertheless the focus in Just Health Care was on establishing equal access to health care for equal need as a basic pre-requisite for equality of opportunity. But in the present book the emphasis on the social determinants of health has replaced the previous focus on access to health care as the main topic of concern.

The second shift is a much deeper engagement with the complexity of societal allocation decisions in health care and public health and an increased scepticism concerning how far even the best theory will get us in fixing the right allocation.

The third shift is an increased concern with justice issues in health in third world countries and with issues of global justice. This third shift reflects a more general shift of focus in discussions of justice and health from first world concerns to global concerns. Daniels has been one of the prominent figures affecting this shift.

The book has three parts. The first five chapters explicate and justify Daniel's current theoretical framework. The next three chapters discuss three specific challenges or problems that any theory of justice in health must be able to meet: "Global Ageing and Intergenerational Equity", "Consent to Workplace Risk and Health Protection" and "Medical Professionalism and the Care We Should Get". The final part consists of five chapters mainly dealing with issues of health sector reform and the application of justice in health in developing countries.

The structure of Daniels' theoretical argument is centred on four questions. First is The Fundamental Question: "As a matter of justice, what do we owe each other to promote and protect health in a population and to assist people when they are ill or disabled?" (p. 11) The other three are more specific, The Focal Questions:

FQ1 "Is health, and therefore health care and other factors that affect health, of special moral importance?" (p. 11)

FQ2 "When are health inequalities unjust?" (p. 11)

FQ3 "How can we meet health needs fairly under resource constraints?" (p. 11)

Daniels argues convincingly that we cannot tackle the Fundamental Question head on but that the Focal Questions are more tractable and that they together provide an answer to the Fundamental Question. He acknowledges that there may be other ways of answering the Fundamental Question but argues that his approach leads to prescriptions for change in allocations and allocation processes that can be applied here and now.

With respect to the first Focal Question Daniels provides an argument along the lines already developed in Just Health Care. Health is important because it underlies normal functioning which in turn protects people's fair shares of the normal opportunity range in a given society. Insofar as we have reasons to protect fair shares of the normal opportunity range we thus have reasons to protect and promote health. The reasons to protect and promote health are thus distinct from the reasons to promote welfare or wellbeing. Daniels sees this as a distinct advantage of his approach since health is a bounded concept and an obligation to promote health is therefore not open ended, as an obligation to promote welfare would be. When a person is in a state of perfect health he no longer has a health based claim on us. Making the distinction between welfare and health in this way requires the establishment of a morally relevant distinction between treatment and enhancement, since many health care interventions can be used both to treat illness and to enhance performance or wellbeing. Daniels thinks that he can draw such a distinction, but this is still controversial as evidenced by the ongoing discussion with John Harris and other consequentialists.

With respect to the second Focal Question Daniels argues, based on Rawls' difference principle, that "a health inequality is an inequity if it is the result of an unjust distribution of the socially controllable factors affecting population health and its distribution." (101) This conclusion is not surprising since it follows reasonably straightforwardly from the broadly Rawlsian framework that Daniels argues within. But as Daniels points out there are other ways to reach a broadly similar conclusion, something which should increase our confidence in this conclusion as a reflection of a state of broad reflective equilibrium.

With respect to the third Focal Question he argues that the four conditions that establish "accountability for reasonableness" (in the technical sense given to this term by Daniels and Sabin) are the answer. If we meet health needs through a public process that fulfils the conditions of publicity, relevance, appeals and enforcement and which involves the relevant stakeholders, then that amounts to meeting health needs fairly

There are two things about this volume that one might criticise. The first is that most of the ideas and arguments and many of the specific analyses have been published elsewhere already and that there is little in this book that breaks new ground. Those who have an interest in Daniels' work or in issues in resource allocation in health more generally will find the book useful primarily because it collects and orders his most recent body of work, not because it contains new and interesting ideas. It does to some extent integrate this body of work, but many of the later chapters dealing with specific issues still come across as stand-alone pieces and not as parts of a sustained argument.

The second and perhaps more important critical point concerns the balance between philosophical analysis and argument and resort to procedural solutions in resolving questions about resource allocation in health care. I am generally sympathetic to the argument that (all of) our theories of justice are insufficiently precise to fix the correct allocation of health care resources or resources devoted to modifying other social determinants of health and that we therefore need a robust account of procedural justice to inform our allocation processes in real life. I also think that Daniels and Sabin's accountability for reasonableness framework is a good contender for a set of practical prescriptions for legitimate decision making about resource allocation, although I am more sceptical than Daniels with regard to how we decide whether reasons presented in the process are reasonable or which stakeholders to involve. But despite my general sympathy for Daniels' approach there are several places in the book where I felt that Daniels gave up too easily on theory and went for procedure far too quickly. There are undoubtedly many allocation issues about which reasonable people disagree, but I think there are fewer than Daniels claims where reasonable people ought to disagree if they seriously reflected on the issues.

Let me give one example. In Chapter 10 "Using Accountability for Reasonableness" one of the issues that is discussed is whether health care workers should have priority access to anti-retrovirals in the roll out of WHO's "3 by 5" program, a program which aimed at getting 3 million people in third world, high prevalence countries on to anti-retrovirals for HIV before 2005. Daniels outlines the arguments for and against giving health care workers priority and concludes that because reasonable people can disagree about their relevance and strength we have to move to a procedural solution. He writes that:

Different people will give different weight to the empirical considerations, especially since they may give different weight or emphasis in their moral judgments to the principle of equal respect, which prohibits social worth judgments in medical context. Some may feel that priority can be given only when scarcity is worst for only then will the social worth aspects of giving priority be framed by specific consequences of not granting it; others may be moved even when scarcity is less pressing. Some may also be troubled by the suggestion that health workers are generally better off than many of the patients they treat, so that giving them priority may seem to be a matter of socioeconomic privilege, especially if health workers grant the privilege of priority to themselves or even administer it.

Because reasonable people will disagree about when priority is warranted at all, and if so about how much, it requires a fair deliberative process. (p. 282)

This argument for the necessity of a procedural solution may well be valid and sound as a policy prescription but, at least, not all of its force comes from an inability to resolve the underlying issues. There is for instance not much disagreement about the fact that it is wrong for any group in society to unilaterally give itself priority in respect to important resources or that it will thus be wrong for the health care professionals to give themselves priority access to anti-retrovirals. We may need process to ensure that this conclusion is reflected in actual policy and day to day decisions, but we do not need process to reach a firm conclusion.

It is also questionable whether there really are such deep disagreements about the importance of "social worth", or perhaps more accurately and less rhetorically charged "impartially assessed value to society of a specific activity carried by this group", and "equal respect" considerations. It is of course true that "some may feel" and "some may be troubled" but the issue must clearly be whether they are justified in feeling and being troubled as long as we are talking about reasonable disagreement and reasoned argument. And it is difficult to see how a reasonable person could deny the force of both types of considerations. If we move away from the context of reasoned argument and into the context of pure politics it clearly matters what some feel and are troubled about, whether or not their feelings are reasonable, but what that shows is that we may need procedure as a political tool, not because there is reasonable disagreement, but because there is unreasonable disagreement that has to be handled and diffused. It is important not to conflate this pragmatic argument for procedure with the argument from unresolvable, reasonable disagreement.


Daniels, N. Just Health Care. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1985.

Daniels, N. Am I My Parents' Keeper? New York: Oxford University Press, 1990.

Daniels, N. and J. Sabin. Setting Limits Fairly. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.