Just Property: A History in the Latin West, Volume One: Wealth, Virtue, and the Law

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Christopher Pierson, Just Property: A History in the Latin West, Volume One: Wealth, Virtue, and the Law, Oxford University Press, 2013, 287pp. $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199673285.

Reviewed by William A. Edmundson, Georgia State University


This is the first volume of a proposed two-volume work. It is an intellectual narrative that begins with Plato's Republic and concludes with Locke's Second Treatise of Government. The focus is private property in the intuitive sense of tangible things that one person (or persons) may exclude others from occupying, using, or possessing. Thus, intangible property and property in persons -- including self-ownership -- are outside the book's scope. But the book is not only about property and its incidents but also, as the subtitle indicates, about the unequal distribution of property among persons and the bearing of unequal material holdings on the individual's moral condition. Its declared aim is "to establish how we came to have the ideas about property that we do . . . to consider why people came to present the arguments that they did -- and to judge whether these arguments are any good" (2). Christopher Pierson, who is Professor of Politics at the University of Nottingham, indicates that "It will become clear by the end of the second volume . . . that I believe that there are . . . good arguments for private property" (2, reordered). The task taken up in the present volume is a blend of intellectual history and "immanent critique" (18) that is preliminary to the defense in volume two of a "mixed" regime of public and private ownership.

The narrative is not intended to be "sweeping," but rather "episodic" and "open-textured" (10). (It manages, I think, to be all three.) It traces how thinkers in the Western canon have appreciated and responded to a fundamental problem or paradox inherent in the very idea of property. Pierson introduces the paradox by way of a parable of William Paley's. Paley asks us to consider the "paradoxical and unnatural" behavior of one-hundred pigeons in a field of corn, if ninety-nine of them were to heap up corn for the benefit of one, for that one to eat or waste as he pleased; while the ninety-nine stood by, ready violently to turn upon one another to defend the fortunate one's exclusive possession of the best kernels, subsisting themselves upon corncobs and chaff. "[I]f you should see this," Paley wrote, "you would see nothing more than what is every day practiced and established among men" (vii). Paley went on to defend the institution of private property on the ground of its compensating advantages, which have to be shown to justify the "abstractly considered" evil of material inequality.

The gist of Paley's defense is that "the apparent evils of inequality are fully compensated by 'the incitement to industry' that arises from unequal outcomes" (vii). This line of defense adumbrates John Rawls's "difference principle," but the basic idea can be traced -- as Pierson's discussion shows -- to Aristotle's critique of Plato's communism in book two of the Politics. Working carefully forward from Greek antiquity, Pierson identifies Cicero as the first thinker in the western canon to suggest that private property has a moral foundation that does not derive from the ordinances of a just, well-designed state. Rather, on Cicero's account in De Officiis, private property is a prior and freestanding institution, which a just state exists to preserve. Roman property law, which culminated in Justinian's Institutes, was explicit and detailed as to holdings and transfers, but rather silent on the subject of original acquisition. Concern with the origin of property entered the thinking in the Latin West only when Christianity, with its Judaic legacy, came into contact (and eventual, uneasy union) with Roman law and Greek philosophy. Having a creation story made it natural for Christians to develop a story about the origins of private property. Christians, early and late, regarded the Earth as originally a commons given to mankind (or perhaps only to Adam), and this premise made the justice of private property and unequal holdings problematic.

Pierson masterfully traces the centuries-long struggles within Christianity to come to terms with private ownership of property. Such thinkers as Clement of Alexandria, Tertullian, John of Chrysostom, and "the Sicilian Briton" agonized over the difficulty of reconciling Scripture ("Go, sell all you possess, and give to the poor . . .") with the ways of the world. Augustine, in the early fifth century, answered that mankind's common ownership of Earth succumbed at the Fall, and that "apostolic poverty" was not a commandment but a "way of perfection" not required of believers, who did well enough if they could resist being consumed by the vice of avarice, which was the true culprit, not wealth itself. But Augustine's was not the final word. Pierson traces ensuing disputations forward through his accounts of Aquinas, the "poverty controversy" between the Franciscans and Pope John XXII, William of Ockham, John of Paris, and John Wyclif. With the Renaissance, communism received a fresh (though ambiguous) impetus from Erasmus and Thomas More; and with the Reformation, a practical refutation, by the example of the Anabaptists' failed occupancy of Münster. Space does not allow the reviewer to mention all of the many names that figure into Pierson's narrative.

The story arrives in more familiar territory as it takes up Hugo Grotius, the seventeenth-century Dutch lawyer who was the first thinker in the West in centuries to suggest that divine authority is not the essential root of entitlement to property. Grotius, Hobbes, and Pufendorf confronted the original acquisition problem afresh, but, as Pierson explains, with a familiarity with both Roman law and theological doctrines. Finally, by way of the Levellers, the True Levellers, and the Diggers, who reacted against the enclosures of the commons in England, the tale culminates in the chapter on Locke, in which Pierson sets out his own reading and compares it to those of our more-or-less contemporaries, including C. B. Macpherson, Leo Strauss, John Dunn, Peter Laslett, James Tully, Gopal Sreenivasan, Matthew Kramer, and Jeremy Waldron. Particular attention is given to the difficulties attending Locke's effort to leverage the expenditure of labor on a thing into an exclusive entitlement to possess it, use it, and to exclude others from expending their labor upon it. Pierson notes that Robert Nozick, who otherwise is sympathetic to Locke, delivered a seemingly fatal wound to the labor-mixing idea with his notorious "tomato juice" example, in his Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974). Nonetheless, A. John Simmons was able to write, "it is usually difficult for contemporary readers of Locke (who approach the text without firm theoretical predilections) not to conclude that Locke's central thesis [that labor is the original source of exclusive property rights] is simply true" (234, quoting Simmons, The Lockean Theory of Rights (1993), p. 249). To which Pierson dryly responds: "In fact, most of those who have approached Locke's work, with or without 'firm theoretical predilections', have found it extremely difficult to accept" (234). Of course, Pierson's tale, in this first volume, has not rehearsed the full range of "theoretical predilections" likely to influence contemporary readers (even undergraduates).

In sum, the book is an excellent resource in the history of ideas. Not only does Pierson engage directly with the texts -- from which he has drawn ample excerpts -- he is also engaged with later and present-day work interpreting those texts. In this sense the volume is a useful (though not comprehensive) exposition of the "state of the art" in present-day interpretation of a number of figures, not all of whom are household names. Pierson includes an interesting discussion of his methodology (12-20), which is more concerned with faithful rendering of what philosophers understood themselves to be saying than with straightforward, timeless assessment, of the type favored by the late Michael Frede. Assessments there are, but they for the most part track familiar criticisms that have accumulated over intervening centuries.

It is not yet possible to evaluate this volume as a philosophical work in its own right. Pierson says that the "conclusion to this first volume offers an interim judgment on the state of the property debate at the end of the seventeenth century" (22). Pierson does firmly conclude that Locke's effort to establish a foundation in natural law for a pre-political right to private property "might be considered a heroic failure" (253). But otherwise the "interim judgment" is evidently not a final judgment upon the interim, but an interim judgment itself. "It is at the close of [the] second volume that I attempt a synoptic judgment on how this very extended exploration might inform our understanding of the property debate here and now" (22). The prospectus for the second volume includes "an assessment of property in the (several) enlightenment(s) and in the debates that preceded and succeeded the great revolutionary movements of the eighteenth century" and from there the "increasingly ideological debate down to the near-present" (22). As Pierson acknowledges, this is an enormous undertaking. Nevertheless, aside from whether Pierson ultimately -- after traversing all this "crowded terrain" (22) -- delivers a "synoptic judgment" or elaborates a "mixed" theory of his own, he will have done a great service to political philosophers and others working in this field.