Justice and the Meritocratic State

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Thomas Mulligan, Justice and the Meritocratic State, Routledge, 2018, 225pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138283800.

Reviewed by Peter Dietsch, Université de Montréal


At the core of Thomas Mulligan's theory of justice lies the idea that one deserves social advantages -- jobs and income in particular -- on the basis of one's merits. These merits depend on context, and thus the perfectionism of Mulligan's theory is formal rather than substantive: "meritocracy remains agnostic about what is good and instead establishes a framework under which the good -- no matter what it be -- can best be pursued." (p.37) The only obvious constraints that Mulligan puts on this framework are the aboutness and fitness principles: I only deserve something if the desert basis is about me in the relevant sense, for instance if I wrote this essay rather than copying it from a friend; and the social advantage I receive must fit, or be proportional to, the achievement or contribution in question. In addition, the notion of desert defended is pre-institutional and, as most but not all conceptions of desert, backward-looking.

At the level of distributive principle, Mulligan translates this core intuition into two steps. First, fair equality of opportunity is a necessary condition for a meritocracy; for example, when Daisy gets into Yale because of her privileged background rather than because of her academic excellence, then fair equality of opportunity is violated, and Daisy's desert-claim to that Yale spot is undermined. Second, against the backdrop of fair equality of opportunity, we should judge people strictly on their merits. The project of the book is to spell out what this means in different contexts. The final two chapters of the book discuss some of the policy implications of this meritocratic ideal.

How does desert relate to other values? Mulligan declares that he is a pluralist about the morality of economic life -- justice, need, and efficiency all represent relevant ideals, even though he regards justice as primus inter pares -- but a monist about justice, which is grounded in desert alone. He also suggests that justice as desert happens to be particularly apt at promoting efficient outcomes.

Throughout the book and in chapter 3 in particular, Mulligan highlights the intuitive appeal of his approach. He cites studies showing that meritocratic ideas are widely accepted across the political spectrum. Therefore, Mulligan not only sees the potential of overcoming the traditional theoretical divide between egalitarians and libertarians, but of actually obtaining public support for meritocratic reforms.

The book has many virtues. First and foremost, it makes a welcome contribution to a still underdeveloped field of research. With some notable exceptions (e.g. Olsaretti 2004; Miller 2001; Sher 1987), desert-based theories of justice have not been getting the positive attention they deserve (!). Second, it is refreshing to see a book that does not shy away from attempting to bridge the gap between theory and political practice, with all the dangers and contingencies that this endeavor entails. Third, whether or not one is ultimately convinced by its arguments, the book is written in a clear and engaging style. Mulligan's position on the many issues he addresses is never in doubt.

Having said all this, the bulk of this review article will critically discuss some arguments where Mulligan's reasoning appears perhaps less convincing or where more development is needed. Doing so will also provide the reader with a flavor of the details of Mulligan's case for meritocracy.

The most fundamental worry about the proposed theory is that Mulligan's theory of merit remains underdetermined. We can see why this is so by distinguishing two conceptions of meritocracy. The first, thin conception of meritocracy is the one advertised in the book. It amounts to the basic idea that everyone should get their due. This idea is relatively uncontroversial, which strengthens Mulligan's claim that it is indeed robustly anchored in people's intuitions about justice (see chapter 3). The second, thick conception of meritocracy is one that provides the substantive criteria of desert necessary to ascertain people's desert claims in particular contexts. Here, people regularly disagree. Just how much money does a CEO or a music star deserve to make? Who is the most deserving candidate for that job? As can be gleaned from the quote in the opening paragraph of this review, Mulligan eschews such a conception. However, without it, the practical import of his theory arguably remains limited.

Think of an analogy. All theories of justice agree on the importance of equality. However, their agreement is limited to a thin conception of equality as equal consideration. It does not extend to distributive questions. While utilitarians, libertarians, and egalitarians all endorse equal consideration, they disagree on its implications for the distribution of social advantages. I fear that Mulligan might face a similar challenge. Scaling up the meritocratic norm from relatively simple contexts such as the ultimatum game to complex social issues forces one to take a stance on issues that invite controversy.

To formulate the same point from a slightly different angle: Mulligan underestimates the significance of pluralism about justice. Take his toy comparison of Ludwig van Beethoven and Justin Bieber. It is clear from the text (see p.36 and p.99) that Mulligan believes that there is an objective standard of excellence -- ranking Beethoven above Bieber. The problem is that, despite the fact that there is an "objective truth" about it, "none of us, let alone the state, know what music is good and what is bad" (p.37). Mulligan's strategy is to trust in a meritocratic economic framework, against the backdrop of equality of opportunity, to solve this epistemic challenge and to converge on the achievements that are of objectively high value (p.37). However, there is no clear indication as to how this convergence actually takes place.

The headaches that this strategy creates for Mulligan become clear in his ambiguous attitude towards the market. On the one hand, he acknowledges that the preferences expressed on the market do not perfectly track objective value: "the deserts of workers . . . are unequal, to be sure, but not as unequal as our markets suggest." (p.127) This is why he does not follow libertarians in their blind trust in the market. On the other hand, Mulligan does embrace markets as the best instrument we have to track objective value, under one condition: "In a meritocracy, the resources which stimulate demand and which determine production are put in the hands of meritorious people. This is the optimal way to ensure that consumers have good preferences, and that our products are high quality ones." (p.144)

I see at least three problems with this strategy. First, it assumes that merit is a generic feature rather than a localized one. Yet, I see no reason why we should think that meritorious professionals -- doctors, teachers, lawyers -- who deserve a certain income on the basis of their professional competence should necessarily also possesses a corresponding competence to detect objective value. Second, the strategy asserts objective value, but Mulligan nowhere argues why we should accept this hypothesis rather than a pluralist conception of value. His agnosticism about the content of objective value (see opening paragraph) is not enough to get him off the hook here. Third, the strategy reflects Mulligan's surprising confidence in expert opinion, which also shines through in his remarks on schooling: "I have no idea what the right policies are, but there are experts who do, and we should act in accordance with their guidance." (p.203) I am not saying that we should have a disposition to mistrust expert opinion, but we need to acknowledge, one, that experts also can and have failed and, two, that there are contexts where there is no single right answer (see previous point).

Let me add two more illustrations of what I regard as the underdetermined character of Mulligan's account, one from the context of jobs (chapter 5) and one concerned with the distribution of income (chapter 6). First, consider the example of the New Haven firefighters (pp.97-98). After firefighters from different racial backgrounds sit for an exam, no black firefighters are found eligible for promotion. The City of New Haven refused to accept this result, but lost in a Supreme Court ruling. In his discussion of this case, and also in the discussion of affirmative action in chapter 9, Mulligan makes several statements. First, plausibly, had there been equal opportunity, race would not have been an issue in promotion. Second, uncontroversially, when equal opportunity is violated, those who get promoted do not deserve their promotions -- recall that equal opportunity is a necessary condition of meritocracy. Third, Mulligan argues against affirmative action. I have no decided opinion on affirmative action, but I find this position puzzling at least in the non-ideal circumstances where equality of opportunity is violated. Instead, shouldn't a theory such as Mulligan's tell us how violation of equality of opportunity affects desert? In other words, if one accepted that the black New Haven firefighters did not have equal opportunities, how should this affect the distribution of promotion and why? I do not see the resources within Mulligan's account for answering this question.

Second, regarding the distribution of income, Mulligan acknowledges "reason to intervene into markets in the name of establishing a more just pattern." (p.134) Yet, I doubt that his theory will always be able to provide guidance as to the form this intervention should take. What level of inequality is compatible with desert? Mulligan's response to this question is that he explicitly does not aim at a positive theory of contribution, but merely a negative one. I grant that his proposal of taxing rents, externalities, and inheritance would significantly reduce income inequalities; and providing a solid justification for a fiscal policy of this kind is certainly a commendable feature of the book. I am even inclined to think that a theory of justice that is underdetermined with respect to its distributive outcome may be eminently plausible. But it does represent a more troubling feature for someone like Mulligan who defends an objective theory of value (see above).

Moving on from this discussion about the determinacy of Mulligan's theory, I shall use the remainder of this review to make two further observations. First, while Mulligan does an excellent job of setting out his own position, there are several passages in the book where the comparison with rival theories, and the general situating of his theory in the larger theoretical landscape, could have been sharpened. In particular, the delineation of meritocracy from egalitarianism frequently presents the latter as a strawman. Consider the following examples: What contemporary egalitarian would disagree with Mulligan that equality simpliciter is an "unjust distributive principle"? (p.8) What egalitarian argues against massive redistribution towards poor children because it undermines their self-respect? (p.77) "Egalitarians are happy to violate any stable norm of hiring in order to, for example, produce a workforce with a particular gender or racial makeup." (p.108) Really? Which egalitarians? The case for Mulligan's alternative theory could have been stronger had it been combined with a more sophisticated and targeted attack of the existing contenders, especially in the case of egalitarianism. A more direct engagement with some of the recent desert theories would also have been welcome -- for example, Serena Olsaretti's 2004 book on desert and the market is only cited twice.

Second, I cannot resist delving into Mulligan's discussion of Rawls. In a nutshell, I believe that Mulligan distances himself further from Rawls than he actually needs to. Let us distinguish three issues in this context. First, the general attitude towards desert as a ground of justice. Here, Mulligan obviously disagrees with Rawls, who is decidedly critical of the notion. Second, it is also clear that, given the empirical studies Mulligan cites in chapter 3, he believes, contrary to Rawls, that the difference principle does not conform to people's intuitions about distributive justice. Third, however, I believe that Mulligan misinterprets Rawls's position on the role of natural assets in the distribution of social advantage.

Mulligan himself argues that natural assets are part and parcel of an individual's identity, and that they can therefore serve as a desert basis. For instance, someone can deserve a higher income because they are more intelligent. Mulligan attributes an argument to Rawls that is incompatible with this position (e.g. p.167): since one can only deserve something based on a desert basis that is itself deserved, and since natural assets are undeserved, an income premium based on intelligence is undeserved.

Now, I have already mentioned that Mulligan is correct in pointing out that Rawls dismisses desert as the relevant concept for distributive justice. However, note that Rawls's difference principle does legitimate income premia based on natural assets: inequalities are justified to the extent that they benefit the least advantaged. For Rawls, the fact that the distribution of natural assets is arbitrary from a moral point of view does not imply that it should not influence the distribution of social advantage. Instead, in a passage from Rawls that Mulligan himself cites without drawing the appropriate conclusions from it, Rawls states: "The natural distribution is neither just nor unjust; nor is it unjust that persons are born into society at some particular position. These are simply natural facts. What is just and unjust is the way that institutions deal with these facts." (Rawls 1999: 87) On this issue, there is more common ground between Rawls and Mulligan than the latter makes it sound. His real disagreement here is with luck egalitarians (as discussed in sections 4.6 and 7.7), whose aim is indeed to make the distribution of social advantage endowment-insensitive.[1]

In sum, this is a stimulating book that presents the debate surrounding justice as desert in a new light. Everyone who is interested in meritocracy should read it. I am looking forward to Mulligan's future work and the directions in which he will further develop his account presented here.


Peter Dietsch, "L'interprétation du principe de la propriété de soi au sein du libertarisme de gauche", Dialogue XLVII/1 (2008), 65-80.

David Miller, Principles of Social Justice, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1999.

Serena Olsaretti, Liberty, Desert, and the Market: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.

John Rawls, A Theory of Justice, 2nd edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.

George Sher, Desert, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1987.


[1] On the difference between Rawls and luck egalitarians on this issue, see also Dietsch (2008, pp.74-75).