Justice and the Social Contract: Essays on Rawlsian Political Philosophy

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Samuel Freeman, Justice and the Social Contract: Essays on Rawlsian Political Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2007, 340pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195301412.

Reviewed by Paul Weithman, University of Notre Dame


This book[1] brings together nine papers by the political philosopher Samuel Freeman, seven of them previously published.  Freeman edited the Collected Papers[2] of John Rawls, the Cambridge Companion to Rawls[3] and Rawls's recently published Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy[4].  The subtitle of the volume under review, together with Freeman's editorial work, might suggest that the nine papers collected here are primarily devoted to explaining Rawls's thought.  But Freeman insists they are not, or not exactly.  He says:

A good deal of the discussion in these chapters is not directly interpretation or defense of Rawls, but rather involves extensions or applications of Rawls's positions. (JSC, p. 8)

This is why, he adds immediately, "rather than subtitling the book 'Essays on Rawls', I have used 'Essays on Rawlsian Political Philosophy'".

In fact, Freeman could have subtitled his book "Essays in Rawlsian Political Philosophy", since 'in' would better suit the lingering resonances of the French 'essai' from which the English 'essay' is derived.  For the papers collected in this volume are really trials in or attempts to engage in Rawlsian political philosophy -- attempts, that is, to address a variety of philosophical problems and questions in a way that draws on what Rawls wrote and, as Freeman says, "shares the spirit of [Rawls's] position" (JSC, p. 8).

Freeman's papers range over some of the most important subjects in liberal political theory:  the nature and varieties of contractarianism, the meaning of the priority of right, the idea of public reason, the problem of stability, the challenge of luck egalitarianism, the democratic character of judicial review, and the demands of international justice.  In taking up these subjects, Freeman partakes of the Rawlsian spirit by drawing on and creatively elaborating Rawls's assumptions and arguments as he understands them, and by posing and dividing questions as he thinks Rawls would.

If Freeman can justifiably claim to have produced work on these subjects that is in "the spirit of [Rawls's] position" -- as I believe he can -- that is because he is so thoroughly acquainted with the letter of Rawls's texts.  The papers in this volume are essais in Rawlsian political philosophy, but they are most definitely not desultory forays into that field.  Freeman seems to have read almost all of the classical philosophical sources on which Rawls drew, to have assimilated large stretches of contemporary and secondary literature, and to have thought deeply about every sentence Rawls ever wrote.

The result is an extraordinarily substantial set of papers.  The shortest of them is 30 pages of small print with narrow margins.  All nine are dense with arguments and exegesis.  Taken together, the nine essays make for very demanding reading.  Students who are looking for an introduction to Rawls would be well advised to start elsewhere.  The readers who will benefit -- and benefit greatly -- are those with a serious interest in contemporary political philosophy, especially those who know Rawls's work and ask what a convinced and thoroughly informed Rawlsian would say about a number of debates and objections that enjoy some currency in the philosophical literature.

It is hard to exaggerate how important a contribution Freeman has made by answering that question.  Rawls rarely addressed objections to his view, and rarely contended with the positions staked out by others in the debates of the day.  Knowing how Rawls might have addressed objections, and knowing what he might have said about the positions of others, are very valuable.  It seems unlikely we will ever see a more faithful and better informed set of replies and interventions than those that Freeman provides here.  The blending of "interpretation or defense" with "extension[]" is so seamless in this book that there are generally good grounds for thinking that Rawls would have said what Freeman does say.5]

The secondary literature on Rawls is voluminous.  Singling out the best essay on any one subject is, in most cases, virtually impossible.  Every one of the essays Freeman has chosen for this book belongs in the small set of articles that is essential reading to accompany the sections or questions in Rawls with which it deals.  If a graduate seminar or an advanced undergraduate class that deals with Rawls in depth is going to require any books at all beyond the primary texts, then Justice and the Social Contract ought to be among them.

Despite the fact that Justice and the Social Contract is already a long book, it could have been still longer.  Freeman has left out some pieces that would have fit nicely into this collection.  His "Constitutional Democracy and the Legitimacy of Judicial Review,"[6] would have fit very well into Part II of the book.  His "Original Meaning, Democratic Interpretation and the Constitution"[7] would have fit in just as well, and is -- for my money -- a terrific paper, one of Freeman's very best.  It would have been good to have included it, even at the expense of lengthening the volume.

Objections to Rawls are generally treated so as to make them more tractable from a Rawlsian point of view.  Some readers will wish that Freeman had developed objections in such a way that they can see why those who offer objections and alternative positions have found them compelling -- especially the objections and alternatives offered by those who Freeman says "reject the entire Rawlsian framework (Joseph Raz, John Finnis, et al.)" (p. 261).  It would be interesting to see how Freeman might have responded on Rawls's behalf to their arguments.[8]

But the complaint that Justice and the Social Contract should have included one or two more essays is a minor one.  And the objections offered to "the entire Rawlsian framework" by philosophers like Raz and Finnis are so fundamental that it might have been impossible for Freeman to have developed the sort of nuanced replies he offers to objections which start closer to home.  There might be little beyond the obvious to be said in response to such basic objections.  And so there may be a good case for not developing the objections after all.

As I have indicated, this is a very valuable book.  The value lies, of course, in what the reader learns by working through it.  That value is most profitably extracted by grappling with its arguments with the rigor that Freeman's own painstaking argument invites.  And so rather than commenting briefly on the essays singly, I want to explore in some depth one question on which I disagree with Freeman's reading: the important but underexplored question of what accounts for the differences between Rawls's two major books, A Theory of Justice[9] and Political Liberalism[10].  There is a great deal to be learned about justice as fairness, and about the appeal of political liberalism, from the answer to that question.  Freeman's attempt to answer it is the best published treatment of it of which I am aware.  While I disagree with Freeman about how the question is to be answered, I cannot overstate how much I have learned from his essay.

Speaking of the differences between TJ and PL, Rawls himself says:

to understand the nature and extent of the differences, one must see them as arising from trying to resolve a serious problem internal to justice as fairness, namely from the fact that the account of stability in part III of Theory is not consistent with the view as a whole.  I believe all differences are consequences of removing that inconsistency. (PL, pp. xvii-xviii)

In "Congruence and the Good of Justice" (pp. 143-72), Freeman insists that we take Rawls at his word.  He says that the differences between TJ and PL were not introduced in response to communitarian critiques of justice as fairness.  They are to be explained, he thinks, by deficiencies Rawls found in his argument that justice as fairness would be stable -- just as Rawls says.

Somewhat more specifically:  In chapter 8 of TJ, Rawls argues that citizens growing up in a well-ordered society (WOS) would acquire a sense of justice.  That is, they would acquire the desire to act from principles of justice and to treat those principles as regulative of their plans of life.  In chapter 9, Rawls then argues that those citizens would affirm or endorse this desire and its satisfaction as parts of their good -- they would, he says, affirm that justice is "congruent" with their good.  Freeman maintains that the changes between TJ and PL were made because of deficiencies Rawls found in the argument for congruence.  I believe Freeman is correct about this.  I disagree with him about exactly how the congruence argument goes and about what parts of the argument Rawls found deficient.[11]

The congruence argument has to show that the exercise of our capacity for a sense of justice is experienced as a good.  How does the argument for that conclusion go?

Rawls provides what Freeman takes to be a promising clue when he remarks in PL: "the exercise of the two moral powers is experienced as a good.  This is a consequence of the moral psychology used in justice as fairness.  … In Theory this psychology uses the so-called Aristotelian Principle" (PL, p. 203).  Because the capacity for a sense of justice is one of the two moral powers, Freeman says of this passage: "This makes it seem as if the congruence argument involves a straightforward appeal to the Aristotelian Principle" (JSC, pp. 156-7).  He continues:

The idea here would be that the capacity for a sense of justice is among our higher capacities.  It involves the ability to understand, apply, and act from requirements of justice.  This capacity admits of complex development and refinement.  Since all have a sense of justice in a well-ordered society, it is rational for each to develop it as part of his or her plan of life. (JSC, p. 157)

The Aristotelian Principle enters into this argument, on Freeman's read, because the Principle states that the development and exercise of complex capacities is experienced as a good.  That is why it is rational for each "to develop [the sense of justice] as part of his or her plan of life" (cf. also TJ, p. 390).

Freeman offers two objections to this argument.  First, it does not show why it is rational for everyone in a WOS to develop this complex capacity rather than some other.  Second, the simplified argument does not support the conclusion that it is rational to make justice "supremely regulative of all our pursuits" (JSC, p. 157).[12]  Freeman concludes:

The simplified argument from the Aristotelian Principle is not Rawls's argument for congruence.  But it is extremely difficult to piece together what his argument is.  The best way to uncover his argument is by seeing how he would respond to the two objections just stated. (JSC, p. 157)

The argument to be uncovered in this way is what Freeman refers to as "the Kantian congruence argument".  The differences between TJ and PL are to be explained, Freeman says, by Rawls's attempts to remedy the deficiencies he found in this argument.

I think Freeman is mistaken about how best to "uncover [Rawls's] argument", if "uncover his argument" for congruence is meant as "uncover how Rawls's argument for congruence actually goes".  Attending to the two objections can bring to light important features of the arguments Rawls offers for congruence.  But it can also mislead about the place of the Kantian congruence argument in the treatment of congruence, about the relationship between that argument and the other arguments Rawls offers, about the sequence of each argument, about the deficiencies Rawls found in them and hence about how the differences between TJ and PL are to be explained.

Freeman presents the Kantian congruence argument in twelve steps (JSC, pp. 158-59).  For my purposes, the most important are (1) and (2):

(1) "on the basis of the Kantian interpretation, persons regarded as moral agents are by their nature free and equal rational beings.  Rational agents in a well ordered society conceive of themselves in this way 'as primarily moral persons'";

(2) "rational members of a WOS 'desire to express their nature as free and equal moral persons'";

together with (8) through (11):

(8) "Thus, for individuals in the WOS to achieve their desire to realize their nature as free and equal moral persons entails that they act from their sense of justice and as the principles require";

(9) "By the Aristotelian Principle, it is rational to realize one's nature by affirming the sense of justice";

(10) "The sense of justice is, by virtue of its content (what it is a desire for), a supremely regulative disposition: it requires giving first priority to the principles of right and justice in deliberation and action";

(11) "To affirm the sense of justice is to recognize and accept it as supreme by adopting it as a highest-order regulative desire in one's rational plan".

As we saw, Freeman says that the Aristotelian Principle plays an important role in the congruence argument.  Freeman introduces the principle at (9), and (9) does indeed play a pivotal role in answering the two objections Freeman introduces.  Together with (8), (9) implies that it is rational for each member of the well-ordered society to affirm his sense of justice.  This answers the first objection.  When conjoined with (11), (9) gets us to the claim that "it is rational to realize one's nature by … adopting [the sense of justice] as a highest-order regulative desire in one's rational plan".  This answers the second objection.

Of course, (9) can play this pivotal role only because Rawls supposes that people have the desire referred to in (8), the desire postulated in (2).  Of this desire, Freeman writes "Rawls evidently sees this as a nonarbitrary rational desire" (JSC, p. 158).  Freeman says that the problem with the argument is that, under circumstances of ethical pluralism, not everyone will regard it as a good to express his nature as free -- where freedom is understood as autonomy.  So, though Freeman does not put it exactly this way, either there will be people who lack the desire (2) asserts or there will be people who have the desire but will not find sufficient satisfaction in its fulfillment.  If this is so, then what Freeman takes to be Rawls's most important argument for congruence fails.  Since Rawls's argument for the stability of justice as fairness depends upon congruence, the failure of the most important argument for congruence spells the failure of the stability argument as well.  Thus according to Freeman, the deficiency Rawls came to see in his treatment of stability is a deficiency in the Kantian congruence argument (JSC, p. 168).

One difficulty with Freeman's discussion is that the twelve-step argument Freeman presents is not the argument Rawls actually offers for congruence.  To see how Rawls's argument goes, recall that in introducing Freeman's discussion, I said the congruence argument has to show that citizens of the WOS experience being just as a good.  But showing that is not enough.  For what Rawls needs to show is not merely that each person would experience being just as a good, but also that -- from her own point of view -- she would affirm that the good of being just normally outweighs competing goods.  But what does 'outweigh' mean here, and how can Rawls show what needs to be shown?

To see the answer, consider a passage Freeman introduces when asking how Rawls would reply to the second objection.  Rawls says:

The real problem of congruence is what happens if we imagine someone to give weight to his sense of justice only to the extent that it satisfies other descriptions which connect it with reasons specified by the thin theory of the good. (TJ, p. 499)

The person Rawls asks us to imagine is a citizen C of a WOS who (i) has acquired a sense of justice, (ii) sees acting on his sense of justice as coincident with other ends he has reason to pursue, and (iii) takes his reasons to act justly to be just exactly as weighty as the reasons he has to pursue those other ends.[13]

Somewhat more crudely: Rawls asks us to imagine a citizen C who realizes various goods by acting justly and whose reasons for acting justly are exactly as weighty as the reasons he has to realize those other goods.  If C's reasons for realizing those other goods normally outweigh his reasons for acting unjustly, then he can affirm his sense of justice as part of his overall good.  Thus whether C will find justice congruent with his overall good depends upon whether the reasons he has to realize those goods are weighty enough to tip the balance of reasons in favor of being a just person.  That, in turn, depends upon what the ends are with which acting justly is coincident -- it depends, that is, upon what other "descriptions" the desire to act justly satisfies.

Consider first the other ends with which acting justly is coincident or, as I shall say -- following Rawls -- with which it is "practically identical" (cf. TJ, p. 501).  "The theory of justice," Rawls says, "supplies other descriptions of what the sense of justice is a desire for"  (TJ, p. 499).  Rawls cites four.  Roughly stated, the descriptions are:

(a) To avoid the psychological costs of hypocrisy and deception, which will be especially high in a just society because citizens will want to appear just to those they care about, and because ties of affection extend so widely. (TJ, p. 499)

(b) To "protect[] in a natural and simple way the institutions and persons we care for."    Since in the WOS, "effective bonds are extensive to both persons and social forms, and we cannot select who is to lose by our defections", we can do this if and only if we are just persons. (TJ, pp. 499-500)

(c) To participate in a social union of social unions, which "bring[s] to fruition our latent powers" so that "each enjoys the greater richness and diversity of the collective activity.  Because of this enjoyment, the social union of social unions "extends the ties of identification over the whole community".  We can be participants in such a union, Rawls says, if and only if we are just persons. (TJ, pp. 500-501)

(d) To satisfy the desire to "express our nature as free moral persons" (TJ, p. 501) -- which, as Freeman notes, Rawls assumes we all have a desire to do.  Let's call the identity of a desire to be just with desire (d) the Kantian Practical Identity.  Why does this identity hold?  Because, Rawls says, the desire to act justly is a desire to act on mutually justifiable principles[14]  -- on principles which would be chosen in the Original Position (OP).  And because of the conditions of the OP, the principles chosen there are such that, by acting on them, we express our nature.

Because in a WOS, the desire to be just is practically identical with the desires to attain the ends these four descriptions pick out, the reasons C has for pursuing these ends "are the chief reasons (or typical thereof)" (TJ, p. 501) that C has for maintaining his sense of justice.  The reasons C has for maintaining and acting from his sense of justice are just exactly as weighty as the reasons he has for pursuing those ends.

To establish congruence, we need to see whether the reasons C has to pursue these ends are weighty enough, or whether they are outweighed by the reasons that C has to pursue other, countervailing ends.  "Here," Rawls says, "we confront the familiar problem of the balance of motives" (TJ, p. 501).  And so Rawls offers three arguments that the reasons to pursue the four ends are sufficiently weighty.

One argument is for the modest conclusion that "however improbable the congruence of the right and the good in justice as fairness, it is surely more probable than on the utilitarian view."  It follows from this that the WOS of justice as fairness is more likely to be stable than a utilitarian society.  So we have an argument from congruence for the relative stability of justice as fairness (cf. TJ, p. 436 for a statement of the question of relative stability).

The second argument is, I believe, the primary argument for congruence.  It is far more complex and interesting than the first.  It draws on all four practical identities established by the theory to show that maintaining our sense of justice is coincident with maintaining a wide system of affective ties.  Thus according to identities (a), (b) and (c), citizens of a WOS have reason to be just because doing so is coincident with avoiding deception in their relations with others, with protecting those they care about and with participating in a social union of social unions -- all of which they are presumed to want to do.  Furthermore, because of the Kantian Practical Identity, upholding the institutions that make all these ties possible is coincident with expressing their human nature and so is experienced as good in itself (see TJ, pp. 462-63).

But maintaining ties to others in a WOS may prove costly, for maintaining them is coincident with being just and being just can be costly.  C may ask whether the reasons he has for maintaining these ties are compelling enough to outweigh the risk the hazards pose.  Thus Rawls says that the "question is on a par with the hazards of love; indeed it is simply a special case" (TJ, p. 502).  But clearly in the world as it is, Rawls says, the reasons we have to love outweigh the liability to loss to which love opens us.  In the WOS, in which all others are just, C would not be liable to betrayal or treachery by others.  The risk of loss by being just in the WOS would therefore be less than the risk to which love opens us in our world.  And so Rawls concludes, "Taking as a bench mark the balance of reasons that leads us to affirm our loves as things are, it seems that we should be ready once we come of age to maintain our sense of justice in the more favorable conditions of a just society" (TJ, pp. 502-3).

The third argument is the one Freeman refers to as the "Kantian Congruence Argument" and reconstructs in twelve steps.  Rawls says that this argument "strengthens th[e] conclusion" of the second argument (TJ, p. 503).  To see how Rawls intends the Kantian Congruence Argument to go, it is important to see what he means by this, and to see just what the conclusion of the second argument is that is being strengthened.  It would be easy to suppose that that conclusion is

KC:  It is rational for C to "adopt [his sense of justice] as a highest-order regulative desire in [his] rational plan".


This is what Freeman's twelve-step reconstruction of the argument may suggest.  But I do not think KC is the conclusion to be strengthened; rather, I think KC follows from that conclusion.  The conclusion to be strengthened is, I believe,

KC':  The balance of reasons tells in favor of C's pursuing ends which are coincident with "adopt[ing his sense of justice] as a highest-order regulative desire in [his] rational plan".

What does Rawls mean by saying that the third argument strengthens KC'?

According to the second argument, the balance of reasons tells in favor of members of the WOS avoiding deception and hypocrisy, protecting those they care about and participating in wider society.  And so that balance tells in favor of C's incorporating these ends into his plans of life in some form.  But honoring the balance is compatible with, say, pursuing a partial and unsystematic policy of deception.  This is because C can fulfill his desire not to deceive by being truthful and just toward some people, while dealing unjustly in other circumstances and deceiving others about his injustice.  And so even if C wants to avoid deception, protect those close to him and participate in a social union of social unions, honoring the balance of reasons is compatible with his not treating his sense of justice as completely regulative.  Rawls presented the second argument as if this were not so "for simplicity" (TJ, p. 503).  But once the simplifying assumption is dropped, the part of the second argument which appeals to (a), (b) and (c) has an obvious weakness.

At the heart of the Kantian Congruence Argument is Rawls's claim that the desire to express our nature differs from the other three "inclinations of the self" appealed to in the second argument.  It differs because the theory of justice shows that this desire is practically identical with the desire to act from principles chosen in the OP, and principles chosen in the OP are subject to the finality condition.  Someone can act from principles subject to this condition only if he treats those principles as regulative.  So C can satisfy his desire to express his nature only if he treats the principles that way.  What Rawls is doing in the third argument is therefore drawing attention to a special feature of one of the practical identities appealed to in the second argument, and arguing that -- because of that feature -- a worrisome possibility is foreclosed which the second argument seemed to leave open.

My summary of the Kantian Congruence Argument requires a great deal of unpacking.  I cannot explicate it here.  Instead, I want to highlight some of my differences with Freeman that the survey of Rawls's three arguments brings to light.

First, I have stressed, as Freeman does not, that Rawls's arguments for congruence are "balance of reasons" arguments.[15]  Crudely put: showing that justice is congruent with C's good is a matter of showing that the goods C can achieve by being a just person in WOS outweigh goods he can realize by being just only some of the time.  It is for this reason that I think the conclusion of the second argument is KC' rather than KC.

Second, apparently unlike Freeman, I take the second congruence argument to be the most important one, and I think that in that argument, Rawls tacitly appeals to the Kantian Practical Identity as well as to the identities which depend on (a), (b) and (c).  And so I think, as Freeman apparently does not, that we can see what Rawls was up to in the third argument -- the Kantian Congruence Argument -- only by seeing the weakness in part of the second argument for KC' and the way in which the third argument "strengthens this conclusion".

These differences would be relatively minor if Freeman were correct that the differences between TJ and PL are to be explained just by the problems Rawls found in the Kantian Congruence Argument.  But I do not think this is so.  This brings me to another and more important disagreement.  I do not doubt that Rawls came to see deficiencies in the Kantian Congruence Argument, though I differ with Freeman on where that argument goes wrong.  But I also think that Rawls came to see much more extensive problems in the second congruence argument as well -- problems not implied by the failure of the Kantian Congruence Argument.

If my thesis is correct, then it has important consequences.

The failure of the Kantian Congruence Argument would raise the question of whether the possibility that that argument was intended to foreclose could still be foreclosed by some other argument instead.  It would raise the question, for example, of whether citizens of a WOS would find full participation in a social union of social unions so irresistibly satisfying that their reasons for full participation would be sufficient to establish KC' after all.  If they would, then Rawls could salvage the congruence and stability arguments of TJ with only modest changes -- a possibility Freeman does not address.  Given the modesty of the first congruence argument, however, the failure of the second argument as well as the third would imply that there were serious difficulties and would force revisions of great magnitude -- perhaps changes of the same magnitude as those Rawls in fact made.

Moreover, a great deal of Part III of TJ, including the important section on a "Social Union of Social Unions", is intended to lay the groundwork for the practical identities that depend on descriptions (a), (b) and (c).  These practical identities are appealed to in the second argument.[16]  If the second argument fails, it forces us squarely to confront the question of how much of that groundwork remains essential to political liberalism.

What deficiencies might Rawls have seen in the second argument?

That argument depends upon the claim that citizens in a WOS want to express their nature as free moral persons.  The problems Freeman sees with this claim will therefore, as he would quite rightly point out[17], tell against the second congruence argument as well as the third.  But the second argument also depends on the claim that citizens of a WOS want to preserve extensive ties to individuals and institutions, and to "enjoy[] the greater richness and diversity of the collective activity" in a social union of social unions (p. 500).  To see what Rawls might have found deficient about the argument, it is useful to ask why Rawls would have endorsed this claim in the first place.

Part of the answer, I believe, is that in a social union of social unions, each member sees others realizing the diverse powers which are latent in our nature, but which -- given various constraints -- no one person can realize herself.  According to what Rawls calls the "companion effect" of the Aristotelian Principle, we find enjoyment in seeing and appreciating this (TJ, p. 376).  And so Rawls thought that we want to preserve extensive ties and take part in a social union of social unions because we find it satisfying or enjoyable to see others realizing the powers of human nature that we cannot exercise, and to be part of a society that makes that realization possible.  But if we find such enjoyment or satisfaction, then it must be because there is some desire or interest which is satisfied by seeing others realizing human nature in ways that we cannot.

Thus as Freeman thought that the Aristotelian Principle itself was crucial to the Kantian Congruence Argument because of the pivotal role of his step (9), so I think the companion effect to that Principle is crucial to the second -- and main -- argument for congruence.  Appeal to the Aristotelian Principle in the Kantian Congruence Argument presupposes that we have a desire to express our nature as free rational beings -- the desire postulated in Freeman's step (2).  I believe appeal to the companion effect presupposes that we have a desire to see the powers of human nature realized in free or autonomous activity.

But in a pluralistic society, citizens may not take satisfaction or pleasure in all the diverse activities freely engaged in by just persons.  Some they may regard as not especially worthwhile or admirable, even if they are permissible by the best standards of political justice.  Some they may even regard as blasphemous or depraved.  If this is so, then in the kind of pluralistic society a WOS would be, there may be some who lack a desire which the second congruence argument presupposes or who have the desire but do not find its fulfillment sufficiently satisfying.  For such people, the balance of reasons will not tell decisively in favor of participating fully in a social union of social unions or of maintaining an extensive range of affective ties.  In that case, not only can Rawls not foreclose the possibility that the second congruence argument leaves open, but the whole of that argument for KC' fails.

Crudely put, the problem with Rawls's argument for congruence is not just with what it assumes about the value members of the WOS attach to their own autonomous activity or to their own expression of their nature.  The problem also lies with what the argument assumes about the value they attach to the autonomous activity of others and to the realization of human nature in the "richness and diversity of the collective activity" in a WOS.  It is the failure of the primary congruence argument, and not just the Kantian Congruence Argument, that led Rawls to think that TJ's treatment of congruence -- and hence of stability -- needed to be rethought.  Hence it is the difficulties Rawls saw with the main argument, and not just with the Kantian Congruence Argument, that explains the differences between TJ and PL.[18]  It is on this significant point that I most profoundly disagree with Freeman's magisterial treatment.

Why did Rawls use the idea of an overlapping consensus to respond to the problems with his earlier treatment of congruence?  Though Freeman does not pose this question, I think he and I would agree on the answer.

I said earlier that to establish congruence, Rawls needed to show that each person would, from her own point of view, affirm that the good of being just outweighs competing goods.  To show this, the Rawls of TJ appealed to desires he thinks all members of the WOS would have regardless of their point of view.  Rawls thought all members of the WOS would have those desires, I believe, because he thought the institutions of a WOS would normally encourage those desires in its members.  Encouraging those desires is one of the ways the Rawls of TJ thought just institutions engender their own support.

Rawls came to realize that just institutions, because they are free institutions, would encourage reasonable pluralism about the good.  Reasonable pluralism implies that some people's good may not include the satisfaction of the desires and interests that the congruence arguments of TJ assume they have.[19]  Thus Rawls came to realize, not just that the congruence arguments of TJ failed, but that TJ's strategy of demonstrating congruence failed.  The strategy failed because it depended upon the assumption that just institutions would make all points of view -- all conceptions of the good -- converge in respects that were essential for Rawls's argument.  Once he came fully to appreciate that free institutions would encourage divergence rather than convergence, Rawls realized that congruence could be achieved only if each member of the WOS located sufficiently weighty reasons to be just within his own reasonable conception of the good.  It could be achieved, that is, only by an overlapping consensus.

I have tried to indicate just how deeply I and other readers of Rawls are indebted to Freeman for this collection of essays.  But Rawls, too, would be in Freeman's debt, for Freeman has done Rawls's legacy a real service by having worked in the Rawlsian spirit so carefully and so well.  Justice and the Social Contract closes with two moving tributes to Rawls written by Freeman at the time of Rawls's death.  These tributes show clearly that the essays in this book were labors of love by an accomplished scholar who was Rawls's friend as well as his student.  In a biographical essay on Rawls, Thomas Pogge remarks that Rawls had a lifelong feeling of having been "terribly lucky"[20].  In having a student as creative and acute as Freeman -- and a friend as devoted -- Rawls's luck held.[21]

[1] I shall hereafter refer to Freeman's book in citations as 'JSC'; page references will be given parenthetically in the body of the text.


[2] John Rawls, Collected Papers (Harvard University Press, 1999), ed. Freeman.


[3] The Cambridge Companion to Rawls (Cambridge University Press, 2002), ed. Freeman.


[4] John Rawls, Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy (Harvard University Press, 2007) ed. Freeman.


[5] Indeed, so pervasively does Rawlsian spirit animate Freeman's work that the distinction he draws between "interpretation or defense" on the one hand, and "extension[] or application" on the other is practically erased.  I sometimes suspect that Freeman draws the distinction in the first place less to clarify his own methodology than to insulate Rawls from criticism for some of the positions Freeman himself develops.  Having drawn the distinction, Freeman can then deflect criticism to himself, saying that problems and over-simplifications are his responsibility rather than Rawls's (cf. p. 186, note 27).


[6] Samuel Freeman, "Constitutional Democracy and the Legitimacy of Judicial Review," Law and Philosophy 9 (1990): 327-70.


[7] Samuel Freeman, "Original Meaning, Democratic Interpretation and the Constitution", Philosophy and Public Affairs 21 (1992): 3-42.


[8] Speaking for myself, I would especially have liked an elaboration of the response to Raz that Freeman offers at p. 194, note 43.


[9] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press, 1999).  I shall hereafter refer to this work as 'TJ' and cite it parenthetically in the body of the text.  All page references are to the revised edition of 1999, rather than to the original 1971 edition.


[10] John Rawls, Political Liberalism (Columbia University Press, 1996).  I shall hereafter refer to this work as 'PL' and cite it parenthetically in the body of the text.


[11] Unfortunately I cannot go into these matters in the detail that I would like.  I go into this matter in much greater detail in Why Political Liberalism (in progress).


[12] Showing the rationality of treating a sense of justice as regulative -- roughly, of treating the principles of justice as "final" -- is supposed to be one of the advantages the contract doctrine enjoys over other accounts of the characteristic motive of justice.  This is clear from Rawls's critique of the intuitionist doctrine of the purely conscientious act, according to which the motive to do what is right is simply a desire to do the right the thing for its own sake "no other description being appropriate" (TJ, p. 418).


Freeman very usefully discusses that critique (JSC, pp. 147-9).  But Freeman's discussion suggests that the problem with this doctrine, from Rawls's point of view, is that it ignores the existence of an alternative "description" of that desire: namely, that it can be described as a desire to act from mutually justifiable principles (see pp. 148-9).  In fact, the real difficulty with the doctrine lies elsewhere. 


In a very important passage Rawls says of the doctrine:


But on this interpretation the sense of right lacks any apparent reason; it resembles a preference for tea rather than coffee.  Although such a preference might exist, to make it regulative of the basic structure of society is utterly capricious[.] (TJ, p. 418, emphasis added)


One advantage the contract doctrine enjoys over intuitionism, according to Rawls, is that it shows that making the sense of right regulative is perfectly rational rather than "utterly capricious".  He continues: "In light of the theory of justice we understand how moral sentiments can be regulative in our life and have the role attributed to them by the formal conditions on moral principles" (TJ, p. 418) -- including the finality condition.  Freeman is clearly interested in showing the rationality of each individual's taking the principles as regulative.  It is surprising that he does not refer to these passages in his discussion of intuitionism.


[13] Freeman interprets the passage somewhat differently; see JSC, p. 163.


[14] See above, note 12.  On my reading, the arguments for congruence show how Rawls can make good on his promise cited there: "In light of the theory of justice we understand how moral sentiments can be regulative in our life and have the role attributed to them by the formal conditions on moral principles [chosen in the OP]" (TJ, p. 418; for the formal conditions, see TJ, pp. 112ff.).


[15] Somewhat more precisely, the first and second congruence arguments are conditional balance of reasons arguments, for they are conditional on what Rawls calls the "benchmarks".


[16] Indeed, I think Part III would be much better appreciated if readers were generally aware of how intricately the theoretical apparatus of Part III is contrived for this purpose.  Consider, for example, one of the critical claims in the second congruence argument -- Rawls's remark that the liability to loss that C would incur by maintaining his sense of justice "is on a par with the hazards of love; indeed it is simply a special case" (TJ, p. 502, emphasis added).  I believe that this claim is supposed to follow from Rawls's earlier claim that "the sense of justice is continuous with the love of mankind" (TJ, p. 417).  This latter claim, in turn, presupposes a great deal of complicated reasoning, one of the ultimate points of which is, I believe, to establish a premise of the second congruence argument.


[17] I am grateful to him for helpful correspondence on this point.


[18] Did Rawls also come to have doubts about the first congruence argument, the one I have described as modest?  I cannot take up this question here, but I explore it in Why Political Liberalism?.


[19] This is why Rawls says "the account of stability in part III of Theory is not consistent with the view as a whole"? (PL, pp. xvii-xviii , emphasis added).


[20] Thomas Pogge, "A Brief Sketch of Rawls's Life", Philosophy of Rawls (Garland, 1999) volume 1, ed. Richardson and Weithman, p. 4.


[21] I am grateful to Thomas Pogge and Peter Demarneffe for helpful correspondence about some of the material covered in this review, and to Fred Rush for helpful conversation.  I am also grateful to Samuel Freeman for generous and helpful comments on the review itself.