Justice as a Virtue: A Thomistic Perspective

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Jean Porter, Justice as a Virtue: A Thomistic Perspective, Eerdmans, 2016, 300pp., $40 (pbk), ISBN 9780802873255.


Reviewed by Stephen Chanderbhan, Canisius College


Is justice primarily a virtue that institutions can have; or is it primarily a virtue that persons can have? Many thinkers take the former to be true. For example, on most social contract accounts (e.g., Rawls’s), justice is characterized first in terms of principles that help to structure a community. People are seen as just or unjust based on their actions relative to those principles. Thinkers in the Thomistic tradition, on the other hand, take justice to be primarily something that persons can have -- a virtue. Accordingly, a couple questions may be asked of Thomistic thinkers: first, what does it even mean for justice to be a virtue; and, second, how would a Thomistic view of justice resemble other traditions’ views of justice, on its own terms? In her book, Justice as a Virtue: A Thomistic Perspective, Jean Porter is an ambassador to non-Thomistic thinkers, helping answer those questions.


Porter’s work is of interest to scholars of Aquinas as well. Her arguments and explanations are rooted in relevant passages of the Summa theologiae (although she also draws on few texts other than the Summa for her Thomistic insights.) Further, she takes up certain topics of more technical interest to Thomists, such as how to reconcile freedom of the will with the will having a habitual disposition. All told, this book has wide appeal on a timely topic, to say nothing of its accessibility and rigor. In this review, I focus on Porter’s arguments that a Thomistic understanding of justice contains several typical hallmarks of justice.

In the first two chapters, Porter lays down relevant pieces of Thomistic scaffolding that, ultimately, show how typical hallmarks of justice are possible. In Chapter 1, Porter focuses on what follows specifically from treating justice as a virtue; I comment on two claims made there.


First, Porter addresses a general concern about virtue ethics. Some claim that the only categorical ethical imperatives that such views might bear (if any) are those that make demands of an agent’s character -- not imperatives that make objective demands of an agent irrespective of character, which justice seems to imply. For Porter, this worry is misplaced, since Aquinas’s account of virtue is moored in an account of objective goodness integrated with a "metaphysical and theological framework" that includes claims about a teleological nature that all humans share equally. Contemporary views of virtue typically are not moored in this way. (p. 15) There is space in his account of virtue in general, then, for such imperatives. More precisely:


For Aquinas, the intrinsic goodness of human existence is foundational for the structures of equity, reciprocity, and right, which structure our lives as social animals . . . Right relations among individuals and between the individual and the community are integral to the attainment of humanly good ways of life . . . and these relations imply claims of right as well as more general norms of nonmaleficence and due respect. (p. 15-16)


Second, Porter notes that, while all virtues aim at a mean, there are different kinds of means. For Aquinas, ". . . the virtues associated with the passions [e.g., fortitude, temperance] . . . observe a rational mean," meaning that they "reflect standards of appropriateness . . . inextricably tied to individual needs and capacities." (p. 38, emphasis mine) For example, recall Aristotle’s famous example where Milo the wrestler’s mean for food intake would be gluttonous for most others. This kind of mean is necessary because each of the appetites perfected by such virtues is naturally aimed towards its own particular kind of pleasure, but not a comprehensive, rationally cohesive good. Also, such pleasures are partially a product of our individual embodiment, since passions specifically involve material change. Hence, a mean that is sensitive to concrete circumstances and individual comportment, yet still rationally determinable, is appropriate. Justice, on the other hand, observes a "real mean," which is "a standard of appropriateness determined by objective standards of obligation, equity, and fairness." (p. 38, emphasis mine)[1] For Aquinas, "the will is naturally oriented towards the agent’s overall good and has no need for . . . dispositions . . . to incline toward the comprehensive good;" nevertheless, "it does stand in need of habits to operate appropriately and well [regarding external acts that draw us into relations with others]." (p. 38)[2] So, an appropriate mean must be set by factors outside of one’s particular embodiment and must also take account of relations we may have with others, since the will is the primary principle of human actions ad extra, as Porter says.


In Chapter 2, Porter explains consequences of Aquinas’s description of justice as a perfection of the will. Describing what it means for the will to be a rational appetite, Porter writes, "The will is the capacity to desire and pursue one’s own overall existence and full development in accordance with some reasoned conception of what it means to live an appropriate or desirable or ideal human life." (p. 71)[3] Goods that humans pursue via the will are, by definition, beyond merely passion-driven needs or desires; that is, these goods have relevant, objective value, recognized (via intellect) and desired (via will) by the agent. Agents can reflect and act on such recognitions of value. Given this "distinctively human capacity for self-reflective activity," she continues, "possibilities for self-evaluation and appraisals of others’ conduct, in accordance with objective, mutually acknowledged standards" are opened up. (p. 72, emphasis mine)


For Aquinas, one may become either well-suited to pursue goods of intellectually recognized value (i.e., virtuous) or ill-suited for that pursuit (i.e., vicious). In the latter half of Chapter 2, Porter explains what this entails. She insists that becoming proficient at recognizing and coordinating such values, especially the value inherent in other people, must mean one respects this inherent value as intrinsic:


the just individual does not respect someone’s right because doing so would in some way promote his own perfection. Rather, he conceives of his perfection in such a way as to include actions such as this, because he is committed to honoring the value and the due claims of another, out of a sense of the other’s independent normative value. (p. 109)


So, becoming well-suited to the pursuit of such goods implies recognizing certain truths and freely moderating one’s conduct accordingly.[4] This includes recognizing persons as persons -- indeed, as other selves -- with certain kinds of claims and respect due. Porter writes, "The agent’s initial inclinations towards fair and respectful behavior and his mature commitment to an ideal of justice as a way of life reflect an accurate sense of the intrinsic value and standing of other people, together with a good sense of one’s own standing in relation to others." (p. 112)


Chapters 3 and 4 are devoted to a closer analysis of just where the hallmarks of other accounts of justice are found in Aquinas’s own account of justice. In Chapter 3, Porter claims that equality lies at the heart of his account. Beyond appealing to the equality of all humans as they share a common human nature, Porter remarks that Aquinas takes a Ciceronian conception of right (‘ius’), where justice is analyzed "in terms of the relations of obligation between unequals," and takes an Aristotelian turn, where justice is conceived in terms of fair exchange. (p. 117) This, she says, implies a recognition of equality between parties. She also claims that social developments in the intellectual and religious context of Aquinas’s Europe, as well as the influence of judicial contexts, are evident in Aquinas’s texts and indicate that he pulls away from inequalities implied in Aristotelian work. Porter further claims that Aquinas’s discussions of obligations to true superiors, and even to God, are tinged with this pull towards equality insofar as Aquinas limits the scope of such inequalities to all and only their necessary extents. Porter goes on to analyze Aquinas’s understanding of natural rights and how they grant all persons, regardless of status or circumstances, the ability to make binding claims on others. She also analyzes Aquinas’s claim that the first principle of justice and natural law is a corollary of the first principle of reason and is self-evident to all, claiming it is ultimately "grounded in an innate capacity to grasp and formulate the normative structure that informs human relations." (p. 156)


Some may object that Porter’s claim about the centrality of equality in Aquinas’s account is overstated. From one angle, one could claim that such an assertion fits too oddly with the judgments Aquinas makes about relationships of justice between unequals, especially God. In fact, for Aquinas, all is ultimately subject to God as the source of Truth; what lies at the heart of justice, then, is Truth codified in the norms of the natural law, of which an appropriate equality is only a part. If nothing else, striving for equality among humans cannot come at the cost of violating the norms of the natural law. This does not directly contradict anything Porter says, but it does claim that the focus on equality is likely more misleading than helpful. From another angle, one could claim that no view of justice that endorses certain hierarchical relations between humans, including relations implied in marriage and "natural slavery," can possibly have "equality" at its core -- at least not in any meaningful way. Such a claim would either be disingenuous or strain any plausible interpretation. This objection stems not from whether Aquinas cares about equality at all, but from whether Aquinas cares about equality enough.[5]


Chapter 4 is devoted to understanding how Thomistic norms of justice are appropriately precise and stringent -- and, as such, enforceable. As Porter notes, "in order for a precept to bind stringently, it needs to be formulated in specific terms, or we need to be able to specify it through processes of discernment and judgment." (p. 173) Further, given that there are often multiple ways that an action could be interpreted (e.g., Aquinas’s familiar example about taking another’s bread to feed one’s family -- is it an act of theft or is it an act of saving one’s family?), if there is an interpretation of an action that identifies it as a true violation of justice, then most often that ought to be the morally relevant interpretation, good effects or good intentions notwithstanding. Short of this, violations of justice become justifiable due to other gains, and norms of justice would not have their characteristic strength.


Porter begins with a discussion of Thomistic action theory, illustrating how Aquinas’s analysis of action specification respects both the agent’s intention in acting and the objective nature of the immediate act. Still, the latter is particularly important for Aquinas, as "this is the operation through which [an agent] enters directly into relationships with the external world and, especially, with other people." (p. 181) Owing to "the normative significance of human existence itself," acts that place one in relation with other humans are of paramount importance. (p. 184) In fact, for Aquinas, "The human agent places himself in relation to another in a direct and immediate way when that other is the target of his causal operation. This immediate relation is morally decisive, . . . in the sense that, unless the agent gets this relation right, his act cannot be morally justified." (p. 183) Hence, a particular importance is attached to norms forbidding certain harms against humans, such as murder, theft, adultery, and the like. Such "norms of nonmaleficence" are epitomized in the Decalogue, paradigmatic expressions of the natural law and "implications of commutative justice, interpreted in terms of ideals of equality, respect, and restraint." (p. 213)[6] Thus, claims of justice in Aquinas’s thought have an appropriate stringency, according to Porter, as the actual, objective harm done in relation to humans can, and often does, override an agent’s good-faith intentions when judging what is morally relevant about a given case.[7] Accordingly, possessing the virtue of justice helps to set one’s moral priorities straight, since it shapes one’s desires (of the will), reflective judgments, and affective reactions so that harms against humans are given appropriate weight when interpreting particular cases.


In Chapter 5, Porter asks: what if achieving some seemingly just outcomes or attaining to the common good appears to require violating norms of justice? On her interpretation and extension of Aquinas’s views, persons are said to have inviolable rights, just as many accounts of justice would conclude. She writes, "We cannot sacrifice others for the sake of a greater good for the same reason that we are not obliged to sacrifice our own life to an attacker, or to compromise our relation to God for the sake of another. . . No one can make . . . judgments [about how one ought to live] for someone else." (p. 255)[8] This is because one lacks both adequate knowledge of another’s particular place in a just society and the moral authority to unilaterally attempt to bring about certain just outcomes.


This does not mean that one ought not have a vision of a just society as such; indeed, Aquinas’s view of justice "implies a commitment to a way of life that is integrally bound up with a certain conception of human society at its best." (p. 269) Nevertheless, along with this, the just person recognizes the bounds imposed by norms of nonmaleficence and, accordingly, seeks to realize the vision of a just society without violating them. After all, "Comprehensive goods are comprehensive because they can be instantiated in many different ways." (p. 264) Further, with justice as a virtue primarily of persons rather than institutions, one maintains and cultivates a latitude of moral imagination.


This last point helps explain why Porter does not include a discussion of justice in institutions. While there are definitive boundaries that cannot be violated, the particular details and concrete context of just institutions can, and almost certainly will, vary.[9] Still, conceiving of justice as a virtue along Thomistic lines does provide for important elements that other views of justice pick up: inviolable rights claims (via the inherent value of humans and norms of nonmaleficence), equality of protection and consideration (via common human nature and limits to enacting even well-intentioned goals), and appropriate stringency in application (via prioritizing relations created between humans when considering the moral value of acts).


To all these is added a benefit that many other views of justice cannot guarantee: formation of human character according to just ideals that respects freedom of will and leaves ample room for -- and shapes -- moral imagination and discernment. Perhaps it is this lacuna that causes frustration with views of justice that focus first on institutions. Perhaps this is part of the reason that Porter claims, "Aquinas gets justice right." (p. 5) Granted, those who take it that justice must be independent of any comprehensive view of moral goodness likely will not be moved by these parallels.[10] One can hardly fault Porter, however, for her effort at explication and bridge building. Thomists also owe some debt of gratitude to Porter for consolidating common ground between a Thomistic view of justice and several other views of justice. While some may caution against overstating these similarities, such a conciliatory work on justice ought to be welcomed, and the good in it affirmed, especially in such fractious times.


[1] Porter: references the following passages in Aquinas’s Summa theologiae: I-II q. 64 a. 1-2 and II-II q. 58 a. 10.

[2] Here, Porter references I-II q. 50 a. 5 and I-II q. 56 a. 6 in the Summa theologiae.

[3] Porter references I-II q. 8 a. 2, I-II q. 9 a. 1&3, and I-II q. 10 a. 1 in the Summa theologiae here.

[4] Porter also includes an interesting discussion of freedom of the will in Chapter 2; I recommend studying it, but will withhold specific comment on it here.

[5] Granted, in Porter’s defense, she claims her view is Thomistic – that is, substantially drawn from the thought of Thomas Aquinas, but not necessarily a pure representation of Aquinas’s own thinking.  Several times Porter goes beyond Aquinas’s own texts, but aligns with his ways of thinking.  So, as an extension of Aquinas’s thinking, this may not be subject to all criticisms of Aquinas’s account itself.

[6] To reiterate this, Porter presents a difference between "natural" and "moral" descriptions of actions.  While the "natural object of the act determines the agent’s choice … considered as a living creature of a certain kind," the moral perspective "identifies actions in terms of the forms of relations that they constitute." (p. 212, emphasis mine)

[7] Porter believes this comes from an understanding of emotions (more accurately: passions) in Aquinas.  She notes that Aquinas’s view that passions are part of our animal layer of functionality lends itself to parallels with contemporary research on moral psychology that indicates the presence of pro-moral affective responses (e.g., guilt, empathy, etc.) in non-human animals.  To continue the parallel, Porter claims that moral development starts with affective responses that are, for Aquinas, essentially embodied and, as such, particularized.  After this, reflection on these experiences affords us access to universal norms.  Finally, we apply this universal knowledge to embodied experience of the particular, concrete world.  As such, virtuous emotions are often fair indicators of morally relevant harms, goods, etc., in concrete cases.  Further, among the first harms coded are harms against one’s own person; after reflection, then, harms against persons – i.e., violations of justice – are typically given greater stress.  Thus, norms of justice can have particular stringency. Cf., p. 187-203.

[8] Porter references Summa theologiae II-II q. 64 a. 7 and II-II q. 26 a. 4 here.

[9] I am reminded of a quotation from another take on justice inspired by Aquinas in Pope St. John Paul II’s encyclical, Sollicitudo rei socialis (1987): "The Church does not have technical solutions to offer for the problem of underdevelopment as such … For the Church does not propose economic and political systems or programs, nor does she show preference for one or the other, provided that human dignity is properly respected and promoted …" (§41)

[10] Porter also does not express explicitly how non-human animals, the environment, etc., fit into this Thomistic account of justice.