Justice between the Young and the Old

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Dennis McKerlie, Justice between the Young and the Old, Oxford University Press, 2012, 240pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199769131.

Reviewed by Wilfred Beckerman, Balliol College, Oxford/University College London


At a time when demographic changes resulting from the remarkable increase in longevity in developed countries in recent years has focussed attention on the burden of ensuring that old people are able to enjoy a dignified poverty-free existence McKerlie's book is extremely timely and important. Should old people have to rely on Adam Smith's 'beneficence' in order to maintain decent standards of living or do they have claims in 'justice'  (i.e. claims that, unless they are adequately maintained, imply that they are victims of some infringement of basic rights)?

McKerlie has contributed to the analysis of this problem over the last few decades and has published valuable contributions to its possible solution. He believes that mainstream theories of justice do not deal adequately with inequalities between different age groups at any time, particularly between relatively affluent younger people and relatively poor old people. His book is an attempt to fill this gap.

He begins his substantive analysis by tackling head-on the question of whether or not justice between age groups has to be grounded in some egalitarian theory. For example, he asks 'Why should we believe that the present unhappiness of the elderly is a concern of justice if those who are now young will experience similar unhappiness in their final years and if those who are now elderly were themselves happy in their youth?' [p.8] He asserts -- perhaps correctly -- that most established egalitarian theories are about equality of well-being between people's complete lives, i.e. that 'the appropriate temporal unit for the application of principles of justice are lifetimes, not temporal stages in lives or related to how individuals are faring at particular times during their lives' [p.9] He then proceeds to expose the limitations of this 'complete lives egalitarianism' as a framework for dealing with the claims of old people.

For this reason he dismisses the scope for a contractarian theory of justice between age groups. For he asserts that contractualists 'usually include the thought (explicitly or implicitly) that the choice [of principles of justice] should be made with a view to the equality of the complete lives that people could expect to live if they were governed by those principles'. This seems to be a somewhat cavalier dismissal of the claim that relationships between age groups could be made within the framework of a contractarian theory of justice. In fact, precisely such a claim has been made by Gauthier in terms of 'mutually beneficial co-operation' between persons of different but overlapping generations (Morals by Agreement, pp.299ff). Though a persuasive criticism of Gauthier's contractarian approach was provided by the late Peter Laslett who argued that 'what is done for children by those who bring them into the world is entirely spontaneous, proferred without expectation of return at the time or thereafter and done as an end in itself' ('Is There a Generational Contract', Laslett and Fishkin (eds.), Justice between age groups and generations, 1992, p.29)

Alternatively, it is quite plausible that the principles of justice that would be agreed upon in a contract drawn up in a Rawlsian original position would specify rights and obligations that would include rights of old people to be maintained at a decent standard of living by younger people. After all, Rawls's famous 'difference principle' is about maintaining and increasing the position of the 'worst off' groups in society, which could correspond to -- or at least include -- old people. McKerlie also asks how far one can fall back on some theory in terms of prudential allowance for one's old age, and presents many limitations on this approach. Though it is surprising that he does not include in this discussion the mass of evidence provided by behavioural psychologists and economists, such as Daniel Kahneman, that demonstrates the irrationality of people's choices, particularly their notorious 'defective telescopic faculty' (to use Pigou's famous phrase) and unjustified optimism.

Leaving this issue aside one may ask -- as McKerlie does later -- whether a theory of justice between complete lives has to be grounded in egalitarianism. But, assuming for the time being that it does, McKerlie demonstrates the numerous fascinating contradictions that this might imply. He identifies three ways that equality may be measured in this context [pp.60-61]. Equality may be measured, first, over 'complete lives'; second, between 'simultaneous segments' -- i.e. between different age groups at the same point or period of time; and third, 'corresponding segments' -- i.e. between the same age groups but at different times. The latter conception would mean, for example, that one is measuring the equality between, say, people over the age of 65 today and people who were over 65 thirty years ago or who will be in thirty years time. He first makes the point in a discussion of the 'compensation' argument for 'complete lives egalitarianism' [pp.23-27], but spells it out in greater detail later [pp.63ff], in a useful set of numerical examples following a method he had initiated in 1989 (Ethics, 1989, Vol. 99). In these examples he shows how redistribution in order to promote greater equality in any one of these temporal dimensions [complete lives, simultaneous segments, or corresponding segments] can reduce equality in one or both of the other dimensions.

A typical scenario is one in which we start with two overlapping generations, A and B, who have identical life paths of well-being, but generation A is born later than generation B. Both have adequate living standards for most of their lives but are very poor in old age. Suppose then that we aim at 'simultaneous segment' equality. This would require that when the members of generation B are old generation A, which might be at the peak of its affluence, would have to make a transfer to them. This would disrupt the initially assumed equality between their 'complete lives' well-being, as well as with equal 'corresponding segments' well-being. (The reader might be puzzled by McKerlie's omission of Cases III, V, and VI from the succession of cases [from Case I to Case VII] that he demonstrates. It would have been helpful if he had explained that he has, in fact, selected only some of the Cases that Temkin identified in his development of McKerlie's original scenarios and has skipped Temkin's Cases III, V and VI. See Temkin 'Intergenerational Inequality', in Laslett and Fishkin, eds, op.cit. pp.191-197).

But the substantive -- as distinct from expositional -- weakness in his demonstration of the contradictions implied by the choice of temporal unit as a basis for egalitarian comparison is that his numerical examples only allow for two generations and do not seem to allow for the likelihood that the benefit/transfer system will remain unchanged. Thus, if one assumes that the system remains unchanged and that cohorts of generations follow one another, the contradictions McKerlie identifies disappear. For, one should assume -- in the above example -- that when generation B was younger it made a transfer to the old people of an earlier generation C, which, when younger, made a transfer to old people of an even earlier generation, D and so on. In that case, A's transfer to B -- in the interests of 'simultaneous segments' equality -- when, in McKerlie's example, A is young and B is old, makes no difference to either complete lives equality or 'corresponding segments' equality. Of course, if one assumes that the benefit/transfer system changes and that there is not a succession of generations, then one will get the conflicts that McKerlie identifies. But it would be these strange assumptions that create the conflicts, not the logic of time per se.

A more intractable logical problem to which McKerlie draws attention [pp.84-85] concerns the arbitrariness of the length of the time period that can be used in the analysis of age-related justice. As he points out, consider a scenario in which everybody in the age groups 65 to 85 has equal well-being over the whole of the 20-year period in question. But suppose half of them were very poor between 65 and 75 and rich between 75 and 85, and the other half were the other way round. So there would be simultaneous segment inequality if one narrowed down the segment to ten years. Conversely, an inequality in one time segment between people of the same age groups might disappear if the length of the time segment is increased. And if it is increased enough we are back to 'complete lives egalitarianism'.

Thus although McKerlie by no means dissents from egalitarianism as an appropriate principle for 'complete lives egalitarianism' he gives various reasons why it is inadequate as a framework for justice between age groups. So he proposes supplementing it by a principle of justice between age groups founded on 'prioritarianism', a view that, as he points out, has been developed by Parfitt and Temkin. Strangely enough he omits any reference to the important advocacy of prioritarianism by other philosophers, such as Harry Frankfurt ('Equality and Respect'. Social Reseach, 1997) or Joseph Raz (The Morality of Freedom, 1986).

He adopts the basic idea of prioritarianism, namely 'Equality is a relative value while priority is an absolute value'. In other words, what matters is not whether somebody is poor relative to somebody else but whether he is absolutely poor in some respect, so that society attaches more value to a transfer to him than it would to somebody else. For Rawls, for example, the 'worst off' are those who are worst off compared to everybody else, whereas in prioritarianism the worst off are those who are most badly off compared to how they would be under a different distribution.

The problem with prioritarianism as the basis for any theory of justice between age groups is that it does not apply specifically to age groups. Indeed, at various points McKerlie recognises this. For example, he writes [pp.115-116] that

The ideas that I have used to explain justice between the young and the old do not apply exclusively to people of different ages and they are not rooted in the characteristic differences between youth and old age as distinctive stages of life . . . So they would also apply to exact contemporaries, for example to inequality between the simultaneous middle ages of different people. . . . If I am right inequality between the young and the old is not more of an injustice than inequality between the temporal parts of the lives of people of the same age.

He repeats this sentiment in his conclusions [p.200].

But if that is his view it is not clear what the point of the book is. Presumably the reason is that, at some times -- including the present -- demographic changes may mean that the burden on the rest of society of providing for the needs of the old becomes unusually severe. This is most likely when, on account of the increase in longevity, the proportion of old people in the population has greatly increased. It is for this reason that there has been much discussion in developed countries of the need to extend the working age, for example. And in Britain the question of how far people should qualify for free bus travel, or TV licences and so on, can now be aired in public. But if one appeals to prioritarianism as a basis for dealing with the needs of the old it has to be admitted that society ought to give similar consideration to poor young people, of whom there are also very many. Being old is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition for receiving some benefit.

If one wants to isolate the particular problem of fairness to different age groups, perhaps it is better to isolate special problems where age is a crucial variable. For example, in deciding priorities for kidney transfers doctors will usually concentrate on the likelihood of success, how long the potential recipient has been on the waiting list, the situation of his family and the number of life years that may be saved. Thus it might seem unfair to old people to be put at the end of the queue -- other things being equal -- on account of their age. But, as I have argued elsewhere (taking up a point made by Sunstein), the old people cannot complain that they are being discriminated against since, unless the system has been changed, there would have been discrimination in their favour when they were young (Economics as Applied Ethics, 2010, p.211). In this context the old age issue is an important one irrespective of the role of the other variables. But, in the prioritarian well-being context, being old may be of no importance whatsoever for rich people. One would not make a transfer to a wealthy and happy person however old he or she may be, and one would not refuse to make a transfer to a poor and miserable person however young he or she may be.

Another general problem with the book is that it is not clear why one must try to find a solution in terms of some theory of justice -- whether egalitarian or prioritarian. At one point he writes that failure to redress great suffering that some people may experience at some point in their lives would be a violation of 'fundamental rights'. But since he has brushed aside contractarianism it is never clear from whence these rights come. One could appeal to a Humean game-theoretic approach to the way a society should preserve harmony and viability in the face of conflicting interests, and argue that the principles of justice that would emerge as a solution to such a repeated game would include the provision for the basic needs of old people, provided they were poor. Failing that one might fall back on Smithian beneficence, and accept the limitations on justice. After all, Adam Smith pointed out that although society cannot function properly without principles of justice, beneficence is a morally more admirable motivation of behaviour. It is too often forgotten that justice does not exhaust the whole of morality.

In the short space of a review it has not been possible to discuss many other illuminating and thought-provoking issues raised in the book. These include the problem of allowance for changes over time in people's values, and the special problem of how far one should respect the autonomy of people suffering from Alzheimer's disease. These add to the depth and range of McKerlie's analysis of an increasingly topical and tricky social problem.