Justice in Transactions: A Theory of Contract Law

Justice In Transactions

Peter Benson, Justice in Transactions: A Theory of Contract Law, Harvard University Press, 2019, 624pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674237599.

Reviewed by Simone M. Sepe, University of Arizona


Central Theses

Peter Benson's book is probably one of the most important and unified works ever written in contract theory. The book's main effort is an attempt at organically revisiting contract theory based on a liberal conception of justice. In pursuing this effort, the book provides a coherent rationale for all the major doctrines of principles in contracts. This is a necessary exercise (one that clearly draws on years of research and engagement) to show that a liberal conception of justice can serve as an organizational idea for the law of contracts that is fully internal to its system of principles.

Benson's deontological approach is remarkably distinct from the two currently prevalent approaches to the law of contract: (i) the consequentialist/conventionalist approach articulated by law and economics scholars, and (ii) the deontological promissory approach à la Fried. These approaches, for Benson, lack explanatory power as they are based on criteria that are external to the law of contracts and, hence, clash with the principles that are deducible from contract doctrines. Under either of these approaches, enforceable contractual obligations rest on the justification that they are subjectively self-imposed. On the contrary, for Benson, self-imposition is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition to establish enforceability. What matters is, instead, that the parties have interacted in a specific way. From the principles of the law of contracts, we can deduce that contracting parties are considered free and equal (i.e., they are juridical persons). Parties also have a higher-order interest in asserting their sheer independence. Therefore, entering into a contract is a voluntary choice of free and equal persons. Metaphysically, the contracting parties have independent agency and do not have to share the end of the contract or even the same conception of that end. However, they do need to share the intention to participate to a mechanism that determines some effects for each of them.

Benson's theory of justice in transactions also provides an explanation to the puzzle posed by Fuller. Notably, Fuller considers the classic premise that contracts remedies (i.e., expectation damages and specific performance) serve to give the non-breaching party what she expected to receive under the contract's promised obligation (i.e., the positive interest of the contract), or for simplicity. Under this premise, when a court orders a breaching party to transfer v to the non-breaching party, this is considered a form of compensatory justice. For Fuller, however, this conclusion is incoherent, as the non-breaching party receiving actually obtains something she never had. This is incompatible with a compensatory justice conception; hence, contract remedies must serve a different function, one that aims at implementing a system of distributive rather than compensatory justice. Benson moves from the same premise about v but his intuition is to flip the underlying paradigm. If the non-breaching party is entitled to receive v, he says, this party must be the transferee of the ownership of v at contract formation. Viewed though this lens, the contract actuates a transactional acquisition, creating, in Kantian terms, a form of intelligible possession. Through this recharacterization, contract law and contract remedies become coherent from an internal point of view. Transferring v at the remedial stage is indeed a form of compensatory justice as courts bring back to the non-breaching party something that already belonged to her.

Benson's reconstruction is not a mechanical jurisprudence exercise, though. Because enforceable contracts require the state's coercive power, the book also provides a rationale for a public justification of contract law. Contract law is in itself constitutive of a system of justice, which Benson calls indeed "justice in transactions." The driving claim here is that the contract process leading to the existence of transactional acquisitions is grounded on a paradigm of reasonableness, which is an ad hoc restriction of the rationality paradigm. Several human interactions can be deemed rational. For example, an exploitative transaction where an individual submits herself in exchange for a monetary transfer can be viewed as a rational interaction under some circumstances. However, this exchange is not reasonable from the internal viewpoint of the law of contracts. This is because the reasonableness paradigm restricts the space of contractually enforceable transactions and imposes a structure of fairness in the exchange process, which requires reciprocity as a condition for the contracting parties to actually be equal. To this extent, although contracts are voluntary transactions not entailing redistribution between the parties, Benson also claims that his theory of contracts as justice in transactions is fully compatible with the Rawlsian principles of justice.

On Contract Principles

The first part of the book provides a unitary account of contract principles and aims at defining the law of contracts as an independent, and publicly justifiable, organizational idea. In particular, the chapters on contract formation set the scene to define the contract process. Contrary to promissory theories, Benson conceives of the doctrine of consideration -- according to which a promise is enforceable only if made in exchange for either a reciprocal promise or a reciprocal act -- as necessarily constitutive of contract formation and the bilateral nature of contracts (Chapter 1). Consideration is the reason for the contract's promise and this is true under permutation: consideration is in itself a promise against the other promise. Thus, any contractual relationship needs to be reciprocal, so that no party can claim any undue privilege against the other -- a condition that responds in itself to a liberal conception of justice.

Parties' interaction leading to contract formation is also independent of their "true intentions;" what matters is only that their interaction makes "contractual sense" from the perspective of a third-party observer (Chapter 2). Epistemically, one can interpret this conclusion as implying that the parties do not need to have justifiable beliefs about their willingness to exchange, but the third observer is required to have justifiable second-order beliefs about the parties' willingness to enter into a given exchange. This objective perspective, however, does not entail that the state has an independent interest in enforcing contracts. Instead, the fiction of the third-party observer is instrumental to select transactions that are likely to be reasonable and fair -- another manifestation of a liberal conception of justice, one with especially important implications. For example, default rules (i.e., rules that automatically apply to the parties' contract unless the parties opt out of them) are a consequence of this objective theory (Chapter 3). Indeed, if enforceable contracts only include interactions that are justifiable from the perspective of a third-party observer about what reciprocity entails, then the rules that a third-party observer considers reasonable should be included in the contract by default. (This is, for example, the role served by the doctrines of impossibility and frustration, or good faith in performance.)

Benson's discussion of unconscionability (Chapter 4) is also particularly interesting. For him, the doctrine of unconscionability is an instantiation of the very structure of contract, that is, promise-for-consideration. Unconscionability is the paradigm of contractual fairness, which ensures that enforceable contracts conform to exchange transactions between equals. In this sense, the doctrine of unconscionability is a complement to the doctrine of consideration. Consideration ensures the reciprocal nature of a contract transaction but does not say anything about reciprocity. Unconscionability fills in this gap ensuring that only two-sided exchanges between equals take place. Hence, unconscionability necessarily belongs to the domain of compensatory justice rather than distributive justice.

Benson's unconscionability test, however, seems problematic. Under this test, if a transaction takes place at the market price, this must be deemed sufficient to prove the parties' equality. If the market does not exist or parties derogate from the market price, they need to positively provide their estimation criteria in order to pass the unconscionability test. This account, however, fails to fully consider how prices are formed in different markets. In a competitive production economy, prices are the marginal cost of production, meaning that all the contract surplus goes to the consumers. In a pure exchange economy, prices are determined by the relative demand for goods, which may result in conventional values being far from fundamental values. And if we introduce market power, those with power extract rents. Still, in situations of idiosyncratic contracting (e.g., bilateral monopoly), prices reflect the parties' bargaining power. Shall we presume all of these market structures to be fair? Perhaps even more problematic, when markets are incomplete, they might clear at a non-unique equilibrium price. In this case, the observed equilibrium price might depend on factors that are external to the market process. What is the fair price under these circumstances? This suggests that Benson's presumption of fairness might be untenable in several cases. In addition, once one fully considers the relationship between markets and contract, there are practical implications. Benson suggests that when the contract price is different from the market price, parties need to specify how they derogate from the external reference point in order to have an enforceable contract. But what is the market price of, for example, oligopolistic companies selling drugs? Often, these companies negotiate different prices with different buyers. Following Benson's approach, if there is an asymmetry in the promise-for-consideration structure, contracts might not be enforceable in spite of what is optimal for society. A deontological perspective à la Fried and the law and economics approach provides a theoretical justification for these contracts, even when parties cannot specify positive estimation criteria. Conversely, it is unclear how Benson's theory can defend similar transactions, which raises issues of transactional insecurity.

The chapters on contract enforcement (Chapters 7-9) are also rich with interesting ideas. Because at formation contracts operate an ownership transfer, a contract breach means that the breaching party is illegitimately withholding the value from the non-breaching party. From this perspective, breaching a contract means interfering with an individual's possession, which is logically analogous to conversion and trespass (and, more generally, to any interference with individuals' possessory rights). Here Benson radically departs from the law and economics conception of contracts. Law and economics is a realist conception of the law. Therefore, contractual rights are deducible from remedies. Since in most cases the breaching party can be freed from her contractual obligations by transferring to the non-breaching party, law and economics, as put by Markovits and Schwartz, views contracts as constitutive of a dual performance hypothesis: an option to perform or pay (damages). For Benson, instead, contract remedies are never a substitute for performance, but rather terms implied in the contract. They are, he says, a response to a civil wrong that interfered with individual possession. In support of this conclusion, there would be little, if any, evidence that expectation damages are the default remedy and specific performance is the exception. In both cases, the remedies consider the non-breaching party's interest, which excludes any optional structure, as option rights center, instead, on the breaching party's interest.

I find this interpretation of contract remedies not fully consistent with the very structure of the contract doctrines Benson employs as the main source for his argument. Under these doctrines, expectation damages provide the standard contract remedy at common law. Specific performance is, instead, an equitable remedy aimed at redressing the inadequacy (we could say the injustice) that common law remedies would bring about under particular circumstances. Conversely, Benson views the prevalence of expectation damages as responding to the adequacy criterion embedded in the conception of compensatory justice. This criterion implies that whenever specific performance imposes a further loss on the breaching party, who could be equally satisfied under expectation damages, specific performance clashes with the idea of compensatory justice. But isn't Benson changing the logic of the argument here? The attribution of damages as the common law remedy for contract breach has a freedom implication which is part of the moral structure of contracts. That is, common law (but this is also true in most civil law experiences to the best of my knowledge) identifies damages as the remedy to protect individual freedom within (and from) the contract. Specific performance, instead, is an extreme solution aimed at protecting idiosyncratic exchanges, which are the exception, not the rule. Therefore, under contract law's system of principles, damages and specific performance are not interchangeable, which contradicts Benson's call for a common adequacy criterion in the use of contract remedies.

On Contract Theory

The second part of the book is more philosophically grounded. It begins with the analysis of the book's central thesis: that contract formation originates a promise-for-consideration relation that realizes a transfer of ownership (Chapter 10). In private law, ownership creates a connection between an object and an individual who has control over it. For Benson, contracts characterize a nonphysical acquisition of ownership. His intuition, which goes against a solid jurisprudential tradition, is to reconfigure contract as having both an in person dimension and an in rem dimension. The in person dimension is obvious, as contract is a relation between determinate persons. The in rem dimension is less intuitive. At contract formation, the parties' agreement ensures that the promisor's proprietary interest in the thing will pass to the promisee upon performance. In this sense, the contract realizes the Kantian possession relative to physical order: it operates a transfer of ideal ownership, which is phenomenologically identified with the contract performance. This function of the contract expands the individual's moral power, where this expansion provides the moral basis for Benson's idea of contract as transfer (Chapter 11).

Relatedly, Benson's juridical conception rests on a view of the contracting parties as free and equal. Indeed, as they are "owners of the same thing at the same time, the parties count as abstractedly identical persons with a capacity for ownership." This argument is sophisticated and resembles the structure of a fixed point theorem. In mathematics, a fixed point exists when a function can take the value of its argument. Contracts that are premised on a view of persons as free and equal necessarily presuppose a fixed point in the domain of contracting, because parties are equal only if they have identical promise-for-consideration. Benson's justification for private ownership also is central to this argument. He conceives of private ownership from a Lockean perspective: an extension of one's bodily integrity on which the person exercises control. For Benson, as long as we accept the right to bodily integrity as a bastion of human respect, we should also accept private ownership as a logical implication of this respect. That is, because the object of respect is the individual will, the right to claim respect has to be independent from the connection that an individual has with physical work. The independence from physical connection is what amplifies a person's freedom and affirms her moral power, where this power is realized via both property and contract. Possession in property enables individuals to exercise ownership through their (monopolistic) control power over physical things. But individuals can also realize ownership through contracts by transferring their control power over things, where this reflects a juridical conception of person and relations.

Finally, in the richest chapter of the book (Chapter 12), Benson analyzes the implication of his theory, providing an articulate philosophical discussion. He argues that Fried's conception of contract as a promise misinterprets the fundamental reality of contract. Under that conception, the moral justification for the enforceability of contracts rests on the duty to keep promises, which is based on the trust and respect that a promisor and a promisee owe one another as moral agents. For Benson, this theory is reducible to the Kantian duty of virtue. The promissory relation does not involve a transfer of (exclusive) control from one party to the other. As a consequence, the breach of a promise results only in the violation of the other's right to be respected (as a moral agent), but does not interfere with her proprietary interest, as no transactional transfer has taken place. Thus, that a contract also implies the morality of promise can strengthen the parties' moral orientation to fulfill their obligations, but is not at the heart of the public justification to enforce contracts, which instead rests on the intrinsic morality of the juridical bilateral relation in contract.

Benson also discusses the relationship between contract and markets. Markets are uncoerced, voluntary interactions, but they rest on contracts as a logically pre-existent system, because market transactions take place through contracts. In this sense, we can say that Benson sees markets as constrained by contracts: market transactions, which take place in contexts of rationality (i.e., the axioms of choice), are constrained by the concept of reasonableness, which is the identifying feature of the law of contracts. But if markets operate through contracts (which is Benson's own premise), then one must conclude that the space of rational transactions that are not reasonable needs to be empty. In practice, however, it seems difficult to rule out the existence of unreasonable market transactions. More fundamentally, I am not sure that Benson accurately identifies the relationship between markets and the law of contracts. As I have argued elsewhere, in the ideal world of complete markets (i.e., the Arrow-Debreu markets), contract law would be a redundant institution. In complete markets, parties can enter in an unlimited state contingent set of simple transactions as there is no limit to the dimensionality of markets. Even legal enforcement would be unnecessary, as the competitive structure of complete markets makes promises enforceable by reputational mechanisms. On this view, the law of contracts exists because markets are incomplete and is designed to be remedial to market incompleteness. (In fact, most of the doctrines Benson examines in the first part of his work can be seen as a remedy to market incompleteness.) But if the scope of contract law depends on the degree of market incompleteness, how can one say that markets are constrained by this law? Isn't it instead the degree of completeness of markets that constrains the law of contracts?

Finally, Benson elaborates his contract law view from a distributive justice perspective. He shares a Rawlsian conception and claims that the book is compatible with distributive justice principles, although in a perspective of division of labor between different sets of principles. Contrary to the libertarian position that a just initial condition will persist in a world of voluntary transactions, Benson defends the need for some background justice conditions to ensure that just transactions continue to take place over time. This entails a role for the principles of distributive justice in determining the domain of voluntary transactions. But what is this role? The starting point for answering this question is Benson's assumption that contract law is premised on a system of needs that can be satisfied through a decentralized platform (i.e., markets) where individuals cooperate by exchanging goods and services. (This idea of cooperation, however, is ambiguous as, again, only under the complete market assumption do markets bring about optimal allocations). Benson then sustains that in a liberal society based on freedom and equality, the domain of these decentralized transactions cannot be an empty space. For it is in this domain that parties, through the law of contracts, affirm their sheer independence in relation to others as agents with moral power. But in order for this to be possible, individuals ought to have an equal opportunity to participate, and this opportunity is guaranteed only to the extent there are some background principles of (distributive) justice. To exemplify: in a society where one party economically and systemically dominates another, how can the dominated party affirm her sheer independence when transacting with the dominant party? This is, for Benson, the division of labor: on the one hand, there are the principles ensuring just transactions (which are indifferent to individual needs); on the other, there are the principles ensuring the background justice that is required for individuals to be able to affirm their independence as moral agents in voluntary transactions.

As a general observation, Benson's proposed division of labor is compatible with several justice conceptions, including Pettit's non-domination theory. That is, the compatibility of Benson's theory with Rawls's principles of justice is not exclusive. Yet, to the extent background justice is needed, there is an apparent antinomy: on the one hand, distributive principles require non-voluntary exchange; on the other, contract transactions are only voluntary. So how are the ones and the other compatible? The answer to this question is that the juridical conception of contracts is per se compatible with Rawls's first principle (i.e., equal basic liberties compatible for all). Contracts are presupposed by the first principle in the sense that the right to personal property, which is transferred contractually, needs to be included among equal basic liberties. Yet, while the first principle requires a domain of contracting for personal property, it also requires restricting this domain. For example, contracts that limit individual-self-determination (in different forms) would be deemed as oppressive and, therefore, in violation of basic liberties.

Rawls's second principle of justice (i.e., fair equality of opportunity and the difference principle), instead, applies to contracts only indirectly by restricting the domain of feasible offers. Under it, contracts aimed at soliciting offers that are dependent on individual wishes (i.e., that exclude individuals on arbitrary basis) are not permissible. If these contracts were admitted, they would be incoherent with the moral power of the individuals who affirm their sheer independence when they privately transact. Finally, as the difference principle is instrumental to ensure background justice, the non-voluntary distribution that the state operates under this principle ensures that the contracts society makes are not concluded in the shadow of some forms of domination. Here the logic is similar to that of the second welfare theorem. To bring about fair distribution, it is not necessary to centralize the economy; instead, this outcome can be achieved via decentralized transactions (i.e., markets) upon an initial societal transfer of resources.

Deontology and Consequentialism in Contracts, Reconsidered

Although I admire Benson's work, as a consequentialist I wonder whether his deontological conception can fully capture the complexities of modern market transactions. Why agents take certain actions, what the consequences of these actions are and how the law influences individual behavior are all themes that are left out of the book. Similarly, whether contracts generate externalities is not part of the book's account, even though this is a core issue for the regulatory dimension of contracts. Note that here by "externality" I do not mean just the classic case where an exchange between two parties has a negative effect on a third party (e.g., pollution). I also refer, instead, to more complex cases where contractual transactions are individually just, but collectively bring about bad consequences -- what economists call the problem of pecuniary externalities. Considering the transaction in isolation (i.e., independently of the individual behavior induced by the rules of the contract) does not help address this kind of problems.

Benson is also skeptical of efficiency as a criterion to evaluate contracts, as this criterion is external to the law of contract. I am inclined to agree that efficiency might not be a necessary paradigm when parties are persons. But when the contracting parties are organizations, efficiency is a viable criterion. These contracts are executed by representatives of the organization but have direct effects on its members. In this context, reviewing the contract under some economic principles can provide a more objective point of view in the very interest of the organization's members. Relatedly, while Benson's approach well explains transactions among individuals dealing with personal property exchange, it is less powerful when one considers complex commercial transactions among sophisticated parties. At least for some cases, it seems to me that consequentialism is normatively superior for explaining how the choice of contract remedies can serve the parties' interest. For example, in contracts affected by high uncertainty, expectation damages, which provide full insurance against the parties' breach, might disincentivize the parties from entering into the contract in the first place. Under these circumstances, it could be desirable that contract law remedies protected parties' negative interest in the contract by means of reliance damages rather than their positive interest via expectation damages. More generally, sophisticated parties might prefer to design schemes where they themselves specify which remedy the court should enforce to best fit their ends. Benson's approach is normatively too limited to deal with these nuances and, therefore, to provide viable and effective guidance for policymaking.

On the other hand, I acknowledge that a difficulty facing the consequentialist approach is the problem of the directedness of the duties of contract. When one makes a contract with another person, the former owes the latter the contractual performance. Under the book's approach, this is easy to see as contracts serve to give parties a property right in some object abstractedly defined, so that a party will owe an object to the other and perhaps some action because of the right of control over this object. The consequentialist approach, in contrast, is committed to the thesis that the duty to contractual performance is not directed but is merely owed by virtue of the benefits accruing to society therefrom.

Thus, it might be theoretically fruitful to jointly consider the deontological and consequentialist approaches from a different normative perspective. This alternative theoretical approach could adapt Benson's idea of a division of labor: deontology for personal property and consequentialism for property in economic production (also in line with the Rawlsian distinction between the right to personal property and the right to means of production). That is, mine is a call for a consequentialism in contracts enlightened by Benson's juridical conception. The advantage of this approach arises from a simple observation: the motivations of the contracting parties are superior under a deontological conception, where individuals comply with their contracts because it is the right thing to do, than under a pure consequentialist conception. The stronger moral motivations induced by Benson's juridical conception could thus help compel contracting parties to perform their obligations, as long as these motivations were reflected in the law. Conceptualizing a contract breach as a form of involuntary property taking, rather than an option, could help create a stronger contractual commitment. Viewed through this lens, the book might help strengthen the force of legal obligations with that coming from moral pressure. Pragmatically, then, policymakers should consider that a Kantian approach to contract may increase moral commitment, but at the expense of inefficient policy outcomes. Hence, a consequentialist policymaker should selectively identify those contexts in which the benefits arising from enhancing the contracting parties' moral commitment outweigh the drawback that this may involve.


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