Justice, Institutions and Luck: The Site, Ground, and Scope of Equality

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Kok-Chor Tan, Justice, Institutions and Luck: The Site, Ground, and Scope of Equality, Oxford University Press, 2012, 208pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588856.

Reviewed by Luis Cabrera, University of Birmingham


While in this, his third monograph on issues of global justice, Kok-Chor Tan seeks to narrow his theoretical scope, his practical conclusions remain expansive. With an eye here to elaborating and defending a luck egalitarian approach to distributive justice against its most prominent critics, Tan reinforces his case for a fully global, fully egalitarian -- if institutionally mediated -- scheme of distributions.

Tan addresses three core questions, each corresponding to a section of the book. These concern the site of egalitarian distributive justice (institutions), the grounding for it (luck egalitarianism), and the scope of its application (global). In Section 1, he engages and rejects claims, primarily from G.A. Cohen, for applying principles of egalitarian justice not only to societal institutions but also to individual actions. Tan defends a familiar version of value pluralism, or the view that values besides distributive justice are important in human lives, and thus that individuals must be allowed as much liberty as possible to pursue their own ends within just background institutions. As long as such institutions put into practice plausible principles of egalitarian distributive justice, individuals are not themselves required to act in conformity with egalitarian principles. In other words, they can ignore questions such as the one provocatively offered by Cohen: If You're An Egalitarian, How Come You're So Rich? (2001).

This would, of course, be consistent with the application of a substantive principle of justice such as Rawls's difference principle, where inequalities are permitted as long as they are to the greatest benefit of the worst-off societal groups. Tan describes the difference principle as "a paradigm example of an egalitarian distributive principle," (12) though he ultimately takes an agnostic stance on which specific egalitarian principle his account would recommend. He also would supplement any principle of distributive justice with a basic needs principle, on which more below.

Tan's general defense of an institutional focus for distributive justice is detailed and systematic. It may not be persuasive on all points, for example, on whether personal economic choices could in total undermine egalitarian institutions. It is possible, for example, that in the absence of a strong egalitarian societal ethos such as the one advocated by Cohen, the rich or talented could choose to work less hard, or, especially, that they could find means of avoiding high taxation that are still in keeping with background principles, as many of the affluent in rich states currently do (see Brock 2009, Ch. 5). A wide enough such withdrawal could dramatically shrink the pool of resources available to distribute. Tan's response, that such a withdrawal would not change the fundamentally egalitarian character of just institutions, may be cold comfort to those trying to pursue their ends against a background of just but resource-hungry institutions (43). He does note that institutions may have to be periodically recalibrated to adjust to changing circumstances, but that does not necessarily answer the question of whether a society lacking any strong egalitarian ethos -- some set of Kantian rational devils all obsessed with finding loopholes in their distributive obligations -- actually could sustain institutions capable of reliably producing just outcomes.

In Section 2, "Luck," Tan addresses the question of "why distributive equality matters," or why accounts of distributive justice should be focused on societal inequalities, as opposed to sufficiency or some other core principle. Tan's answer is constructed upon what he sees as basic intuitions about human moral equality. Individuals should not be made worse off -- compared to an equal baseline -- because of bad luck, though they can be held responsible for poor choices. His favored institutional luck egalitarianism would limit the application of egalitarian principles to cases where bad luck is converted into actual disadvantage compared to others within shared institutions. Thus, in his example, the fact that one is born "ugly" may be bad luck, but it only becomes a matter of justice if shared institutions serve to convert it into a social disadvantage (128).

Tan characterizes his luck egalitarianism as a "modest" account. That is because of its institutional focus, and also a stipulation that hard questions about just how far individuals can be held responsible for poor choices fall outside the bounds of the theory. The domain of egalitarian justice, he contends, can be limited to distributions of social burdens and benefits among persons who already are above some threshold of sufficiency or basic needs. If they fall below such a threshold, it is not principles of distributive justice which are applicable, but those of humanitarian assistance. Distinctions between whether a person's condition is the result of bad luck or bad choices are "irrelevant for the purpose of determining whether a person who is floundering due to a lack of basic goods ought to be rescued" (100).

I suggest that Tan's account would need to work harder to demonstrate that comprehensive protections for those who fall below the threshold actually would be consistent with luck egalitarianism, and that such protections would not have strong implications for distributive justice. It is a staple of medical ethics, for example, that repeated poor choices by individuals can lead to hard distributive choices. Consider the case of the heavy drinker who ravages not only her or his original liver, but then a transplanted one. How is that person's next claim to the distribution of a very scarce and valuable good to be weighed? A range of other, more general health issues is salient to luck egalitarian distributions (Wikler 2002), as are issues in many other areas where personal choices could put persons below the threshold and also strain distributive resources. Much more could be said about how it is justifiable to presume that only goods not related to basic needs are appropriately subject to distributive justice.

In Section 3, "Global Justice," Tan makes the case for a global extension of institutional luck egalitarianism. His central claim, that "there is a global institutional practice that renders matters of luck into social advantages for some and disadvantages for others," (149) is developed with nuance. He does not contend that only global institutions have these characteristics, but he offers a persuasive case that they are among institutions which do so, and thus would appropriately be considered as a site of egalitarian justice within an institutional luck egalitarian account.

This final section of the book, however, is also where some of the most significant challenges can be raised, mostly around omissions or incomplete treatments of salient issues. Some of the issues did receive attention in Tan's engagement with liberal nationalism in Justice Without Borders (2006), but it would have been appropriate to update discussions here through engagement with the more recent literature, as well as to directly engage the issues within the bounds of the current argument.

I will note first the treatment of national prerogatives in the global luck egalitarian frame. Tan offers an analogy between individuals and states in defending a kind of global value pluralism, where individual states or nations would be free to follow their own pursuits against a background of global distributive justice (177-81). Just as domestically "individuals are free to favor their familiar commitments and concerns; so too, within the terms of a just global structure, persons and their nations are at liberty to promote domestic ends and national justice" (179). Such domestic ends are said to include deviations from egalitarian justice, but Tan does not specify the bounds of acceptable deviation within just global background institutions. Perhaps more significantly, he does not consider the possible importance of free movement for individuals in such a context. A now expansive literature considers whether individuals should be permitted to move freely across borders in pursuit of personal projects, or for plain economic betterment in non-ideal circumstances (see Seglow 2006). Some engagement with that dialogue is crucial for determining whether states' personal prerogatives would justifiably include rigid borders in a global institutional luck egalitarian scheme.

Second, some detailed engagement with the recent literature on global equal opportunity would seem appropriate. That would include in particular critiques contending that luck egalitarians give too little attention to how individuals from different cultures are likely to want different kinds of opportunities equalized (see Caney 2007). Tan's account is among those which could support radical changes in the direction of equalizing individual opportunities globally, but it is mostly disconnected from the actual dialogue about global equal opportunity.

Finally, some more direct or extended engagement with non-institutional luck egalitarians, including Caney, would have strengthened Tan's claims for the necessity of demonstrating that institutions have certain effects on person's lives before the application of principles of distributive justice can be justified. At root, Tan's "institutional impact thesis" (159) contends that something valuable is or could be taken from individuals when "an imposed social order has the effect of converting arbitrary traits about persons into differential social advantages and disadvantages" (159). Yet, such an approach cannot account for the things also taken from individuals by exclusion or isolation. Nor does it address ways in which individuals who are embedded in just background institutions will likely have much greater access to resources and opportunities in exchange for whatever restrictions are imposed on them by such institutions.

Tan considers it a virtue of his modest luck-egalitarian account that, unlike a non-institutionally focused luck egalitarianism, it need not be committed to addressing "absurd" inequalities or disadvantages outside of existing institutional relationships, such as ones faced by those on some newly discovered planet (166-70). Yet, his account still would need to answer hard questions about societies which remain largely isolated from domestic and global institutions, e.g., the 14 tribes still reported as uncontacted in the Amazon Basin (Phillips 2011). Those kinds of cases may be rare, but considering them, and especially directly engaging general arguments for a non-institutional egalitarianism (Caney 2005; see also Buchanan 2004, 217-18), would enhance the defense of an institutional approach, in particular its claim that those not embedded in shared institutions are owed only humanitarian assistance.

While the argument overall would have been more persuasive had such issues been addressed, the strengths of Justice, Institutions, and Luck are many. It offers one of the most systematic and nuanced treatments to date of a global luck egalitarian approach, and it adds important clarity to the ongoing dialogue about just how global distributive justice can and should be conceived. Further, Tan's writing is a model of both precision and accessibility. He is adept at showing what is at stake in major debates and at identifying and leading the reader through important positions in them. This book would make an excellent teaching tool.


Brock, Gillian. 2009. Global Justice: A Cosmopolitan Account. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Buchanan, Allen. 2004. Justice, Legitimacy, and Self-Determination: Moral Foundations for International Law. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Caney, Simon. 2007. "Justice, Borders and the Cosmopolitan Ideal: A Reply to Two Critics." Journal of Global Ethics 3(2): 269-76.

Cohen, G.A. 2001. If You're An Egalitarian, How Come You're So Rich? Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Phillips, Tom. "Uncontacted Tribe Found Deep in Amazon Rainforest," The Guardian, June 22. Online.

Seglow, Jonathan. 2005. "The Ethics of Immigration," Political Studies Review 3(3): 317-34.

Tan, Kok-Chor. 2006. Justice Without Borders: Cosmopolitanism, Nationalism and Patriotism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Wikler, Daniel. 2002. "Personal and Social Responsibility for Health," Ethics and International Affairs 16(2): 47-55.