Justice, Migration, and Mercy

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Michael Blake, Justice, Migration, and Mercy, Oxford University Press, 2020, 266pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190879556.

Reviewed by Anna Stilz, Princeton University


In the United States, a comprehensive immigration reform bill was passed by the Senate in 2013, but eventually failed in the House. This bill was structured around a compromise -- increased border security measures were to be exchanged for immigration amnesty for undocumented migrants currently inside the US. Many centrist politicians (including those in the bipartisan "Gang of Eight" that sponsored the bill) supported both of these provisions.

From a philosophical point of view, however, this combination of principles might seem incoherent. If undocumented migrants ought to be put on a path to citizenship, then perhaps they did nothing wrong in crossing the border in the first place. If so, the US should not be using force to repel peaceful people who merely wish to build a better life in this country. On the other hand, perhaps sovereign states have the right to control their borders, excluding any migrants they have not expressly authorized to enter. But then why shouldn't undocumented migrants be deported, or even punished, for violating the state's laws?

Michael Blake's creative and thought-provoking book offers a philosophical account of migration ethics that renders coherent the centrist position of the sort found in the 2013 bill. At the heart of Blake's book is a distinction between two kinds of reasons that bear on migration: reasons of justice and reasons of mercy. As a matter of justice, Blake argues, the US is entitled to exclude unauthorized migrants and to enforce strong border controls. Yet as a matter of mercy, the US ought to waive its right to deport the undocumented, granting them the right to stay. As Marco Rubio put it, defending the 2013 bill: "They did violate our immigration laws and they don't have a legal right to be here . . . [but] this is who we are. We are the most compassionate nation on earth."[1]

In the increasingly polarized literature on migration, Blake's approach will be controversial. The book defends some bracing conclusions: Blake argues that would not be unjust for the state to deport undocumented migrants, to prevent the spouses and family members of its own citizens from settling, and to close its borders to all would-be migrants except refugees (though these acts would be unmerciful).

Still, even those who disagree (as I do) with these policy conclusions will find the book of considerable philosophical interest. Blake connects migration ethics to a broader picture of what states owe members and outsiders in a world structured as a system of separate legal jurisdictions. This is a real innovation in the migration literature, and an idea worth building upon.

Though he ultimately defends the state's sovereign prerogatives, Blake's account in fact begins from a broad cosmopolitan duty of justice. This is the duty to respect, protect, and fulfill every human being's claim to the circumstances in which she can live as an autonomous agent. "Institutions such as states," Blake says, "cannot restrict their moral attention to the autonomy of their own citizens; they are commanded to work together to build a world in which all individuals are provided with the rights and resources needed to live autonomous lives" (12). The institution of the state is essential in discharging this duty, in Blake's view, since state legal systems are necessary to provide the "settled expectations" that ensure people can lead autonomous lives.

Yet this general duty to protect autonomy, as Blake sees it, has different implications in different institutional contexts. Where the state exercises coercive political authority over an individual, it owes that person more protections for autonomy than it does to those whom it does not govern coercively. In particular, while human rights are direct implications of the duty to protect autonomy, other rights are civil or membership rights, required as part of justifying the state's rule to its own constituents. The cosmopolitan duty of justice on which Blake's account is based is thus an institutionally differentiated duty: while all agents have a duty to respect, protect, and fulfill one another's autonomy, this duty requires different acts in different contexts.

Institutional differentiation is important for Blake's account of the state's right to exclude, the centerpiece of his theory of migration justice. Blake grounds the right to exclude in a "presumptive right to be free from others imposing obligations on us without our consent" (74). This claim has relevance for migration because while the obligation to respect human rights is global in scope, the obligation to protect and fulfill human rights is generally local: it binds those within a specific jurisdiction. When a would-be migrant whose human rights were already protected and fulfilled in her home state enters another state's territory, Blake argues that she imposes a new obligation on its inhabitants to contribute to guaranteeing her rights. This limits the freedom of those inhabitants, and given the presumptive right to be free from imposed obligations, Blake argues that they have the right to reject would-be immigrants whose human rights are already protected and fulfilled elsewhere.

To be sure, people have only a presumptive right to be free from unwanted obligations: in some contexts, there will be standing reasons why we are bound to acquire new obligations to others. Yet absent some standing reason, it is wrong to impose new obligations on people without their consent, and Blake holds that there is a standing reason to become obliged to new migrants only if their rights are not adequately protected at home. He is clear that what matters here is not the cost of the new obligation (indeed, the obligation to a new immigrant might not be costly at all), but simply its unwanted imposition.

Blake's ingenious argument has a number of attractions for those who wish to defend the state's right to exclude. In particular, it flows wholly from a liberal account of political morality and makes no recourse to the values of nationhood, culture, or self-determination.

Yet one might also question Blake's argument. First, it is not so clear that we have a weighty objection to others' imposing non-onerous duties on us. When I cross the street, I impose a duty on drivers to slow down; when I take a shopping cart at the store, I impose a duty on you not to take it for yourself; when I sit down in a chair in the lecture hall, I impose a duty on you not to sit there, and so on. These duties do limit others' moral freedom in trivial ways, but their unilateral imposition seems perfectly permissible. Everyday life would be impossible if we were obliged to seek others' consent every time we imposed a duty on them. Of course, it does seem more objectionable for others to unilaterally burden us with costly duties, or to force us into burdensome personal relationships. Yet migration need not always be costly, nor does it force people into burdensome personal relationships.

Of course, Blake does allow that there are some contexts where we have a standing duty to acquire new obligations: perhaps the cases of driving, shopping, and classroom etiquette cited above are cases of this kind. But that only shifts the question further back: when exactly do we have standing duties to acquire new obligations? In the migration context, Blake's answer is: only when a migrant lacks access to institutions that protect her human rights.

Yet without a more extended defense, it is unclear whether this is the right answer. In everyday life, we take ourselves to have duties to become obliged to people in a range of contexts for a range of reasons. If my elderly neighbor is struggling to manage her shopping, I believe I have some duty to help, if I can do so at reasonable cost. If my fellow student is sitting alone, day after day, in the school cafeteria, I have a duty to go sit and talk with her. These are duties to become obliged to people, when we can do so without significant cost to ourselves, that have little to do with the fulfillment of basic human rights. Such weak positive duties might extend to migrants too. If so, might we also be obliged not to exclude migrants, at least when we could allow them to settle at little or no cost to us?

Though Blake's defense of the right to exclude may strike the reader as a defense of the status quo, it is important to note the ways in which his account is (perhaps significantly) revisionist. Blake argues that "we can only justify the coercive force of the border if we use it against people whose rights are adequately protected in their current homes" (83). In his view, there are stringent duties towards those whose human rights are not adequately protected: all such persons should be treated as refugees, with an internationally recognized claim to migrate. Indeed, he allows that some persecuted refugees may be entitled to positive aid from wealthy states in relocating to their territories. The implications of Blake's view will depend on precisely which rights-guarantees are required, since those who fall below the threshold of adequate rights-protection have strong rights to migrate.

What constitutes adequate rights-protection? Here Blake is somewhat unclear. Very severe violations -- genocide, war crimes, ethnic cleansing, and crimes against humanity -- definitely trigger the strong right to migrate. Blake also allows that "mere tyranny" (authoritarian or undemocratic governance of a more ordinary sort) may void the state's right to exclude. What about severe economic disadvantage? Blake's discussions of this issue are ambiguous (see 149, 155, and 176-177). On the one hand, Blake concedes that the threshold of human rights protection should extend to at least some economic rights: he holds, for example, that an undocumented migrant who was severely impoverished may "have a right to cross borders in search of economic opportunities for his family" (149). He also speaks of a cosmopolitan duty to provide all individuals with the "rights and resources needed to build autonomous lives" (12), and worries that many migrants face "significant hurdles to the ability to build lives of dignity" (176). On the other hand, he equates adequate economic rights-protection with not facing "death by starvation" (155), or "avoidable death or impairment" (176).

One might, however, think that the economic protections required to build an autonomous life go beyond the avoidance of starvation, death, or impairment. One can be free of these grievous ills yet still face significant hurdles to building a life of dignity. What about lack of access to education, the inability to participate actively in the life of one's society, stigmatization, economic exploitation, or political domination? Blake does not develop a sufficiently precise account of when poverty violates fundamental entitlements. This ambiguity makes it difficult to gauge the implications of his view. If the threshold of rights-protection is high, many impoverished people in the world today will count as refugees, and the state's right to exclude will be narrow. Conversely, if the threshold is low, the state's right to exclude will be very broad.

Wherever we place the threshold of international duty, Blake is clear that some would-be migrants fall above it, and that if they do, the state does not wrong them by exclusion. For him, this definitely includes those who wish to migrate out of mere affinity for a new place; economic migrants who seek desirable opportunities (i.e., who are not forced to move out of deprivation); and those who migrate for love, to be with their spouse or family. None of these people, argues Blake, have a claim in justice to migrate. Indeed, Blake holds that the state would not wrong these people by deporting them if they have come without permission, even if they are long settled. By crossing the border without authorization, they have forfeited their right to form plans and attachments on the state's territory (149-150).

Nonetheless, Blake argues that there are some moral reasons that bear on a state's treatment of migrants in this category: these are reasons of mercy. Blake defines mercy as "the virtue of not giving someone the harsh treatment we are permitted in justice to provide them, out of a moral concern for the effects of the treatment on the recipient of that treatment" (189). He finds sources for duties of mercy in the criminal law (e.g., the practice of granting pardons and leniency in sentencing), in many religious traditions, in the ethics of care, and in Kantian duties of beneficence. Mercy is distinguished from justice by the fact that mercy's recipients cannot claim it as a matter of right; the granters of mercy have some "latitude" in deciding who should be the targets of mercy and how to provide it; and mercy cannot be coercively enforced (202-203). There are reasons of mercy, Blake argues, to grant immigration rights to at least some migrants who wish to enter for reasons of affinity or opportunity, not to deport those undocumented migrants who have been long settled, and to allow family unification.

By appealing to the virtue of mercy, Blake hopes to provide a critical perspective on how borders are currently policed without endorsing open borders. Even though there is a right to exclude many migrants, there are also principles by which to assess whether the right to exclude is used well or poorly.

Blake's invocation of duties of mercy in migration is an innovative move, one that harkens back to a long philosophical tradition of distinguishing duties of justice and beneficence. Yet the concept of mercy has some ambiguities. It is unclear from Blake's discussion whether mercy is a discretionary virtue or a binding moral duty. Do we do anything wrong in failing to display mercy? Is mercy a purely discretionary act? Is it an act of supererogation? Or is it a mandatory moral duty, albeit an unenforceable one?

How we resolve these ambiguities has important implications for interpreting Blake's view. One radical way to read Blake's book (admittedly somewhat against the grain) would be to see it as a plea for suspending the deportation of impoverished migrants. Blake allows that the costs to many economic migrants of obeying migration law are very high: indeed, we ourselves would cross the border were we in the migrant's position (183). If mercy is a moral duty, and not just a discretionary act, then we can be said to act wrongly -- and gravely so -- by deporting these migrants. On this reading, suspension of deportation for impoverished migrants is morally required. Though this conclusion may seem far-reaching, perhaps it is one Blake should endorse.


[1] https://www.c-span.org/video/?312156-1/gang-eight-senators-unveils-bipartisan-immigration-bill