Justification and Critique: Towards a Critical Theory of Politics

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Rainer Forst, Justification and Critique: Towards a Critical Theory of Politics, Ciaran Cronin (tr.), Polity, 2014, 216pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745652290.

Reviewed by Uwe Steinhoff, The University of Hong Kong


Rainer Forst's new book is, according to him,

an attempt to develop the program of a theory of justification further -- first when it comes to clarifying basic concepts of political philosophy and, in addition, as regards its implications for critical theory and the possible limits of a mode of thought which accords central importance to discursive justice. (viii)

These concepts prominently include human dignity, human rights, justice, justification, recognition, and tolerance, among others. Yet the book is a rather unsystematic collection of essays, and hence the connections between the different chapters are often tenuous. In particular the last part (“Beyond Justice”), which contains three chapters discussing Henrik Ibsen, Stanley Cavell, and Theodor Adorno, Hannah Arendt, and utopian literature, has little to do with the preceding part of the book. The biggest deficit of Justification and Critique (JaC), however, is that for someone "who has so much to say about justification" (viii), Forst provides little by way of justification for his own core ideas, which have remained basically unchanged -- and undefended -- since his publication of Kontexte der Gerechtigkeit (Contexts of Justice, CoJ) in 1994.

In the following I will concentrate on Forst's "principle of justification" and his (individual) "right to justification" (in doing so I will also refer to his previous works).

In Contexts of Justice Forst noted that the stages of Habermas's discourse theory of morality "consist in a reconstruction of the argumentative presuppositions of justifying norms, one that leads to the formulation of a discourse principle that serves as a principle of morality or democracy . . . for justifying (in each case different) norms under conditions of mutual and forceless argumentation" (CoJ, 192).[1] Forst himself, however, does not attempt to reconstruct argumentative presuppositions, nor does he attempt to show that they would lead to the discourse principle. Instead, he simply stipulates (more on this below) an equivalent to the discourse principle (without engaging any critics of discourse ethics), namely his own "principle of justification," on which in turn a "right to justification" is supposed to be based (JaC 151, 170-171).

This basic right to justification is based on the recursive general principle that every norm that is to legitimize the use of force (or, more broadly speaking, a morally relevant interference with other's actions) claims to be reciprocally and generally valid and therefore needs to be justifiable by reciprocally and generally non-rejectable reasons. Reciprocity here means that neither party makes any claim to certain rights or resources that are denied to others (reciprocity of content) and that neither party projects its own reasons (values, interests, needs) onto others in arguing for its claims (reciprocity of reasons). One must be willing to argue for basic norms that are to be reciprocally and generally valid and binding with reasons that are not based on contested 'higher' truths or conceptions of the good that can reasonably be questioned and rejected. Generality, then, means that the reasons for such norms need to be shareable among all persons affected, not just the dominant parties. (JaC, 140)

The question, of course, is why one should accept any of these claims; not least since the meaning of some of them is not even clear. For example, what is the meaning of the parentheses? Are only norms that legitimize the use of force morally relevant? If so, why? Or are norms that legitimize non-violent interference with other people's actions also morally relevant? And why is only interference relevant? Why not non-interference (like refraining from helping somebody in need)? Moreover, by which criteria is it to be decided what is "morally relevant" in the first place? Is a criterion that stands in need of justification simply being presupposed here? Furthermore, and most importantly, why should a norm's validity depend on its justifiability to everyone (at least to every person affected)? In the end, does this whole idea that moral principles have to be justified to everybody not rest on a confusion of two senses of justification: justification in the sense of the speech act of giving to someone a justification for something, and justification in the sense of a proposition's or principle's property of being justified for someone, that is, of being legitimately applicable to her, him, or it? Is it not quite possible that something is justified for a child molester or genocidal dictator, that is, legitimately applicable to him or her, without anybody having to (be able to) justify it to him or her?[2] Forst, despite his emphasis on justification, answers none of these questions, in fact, he does not ask them, nor does he provide a conceptual analysis of the concept of justification.

Instead, Forst simply claims that "moral persons recognize one another in accordance with this duty [of justification] as persons who have an irreducible right to justification" (RtJ, 57).[3] Alluding to Kant, he sees in this "'original' form of moral recognition . . . a 'fact' of justificatory reason" (JaC, 123). "Without this insight into, and acceptance of, the duty to provide justifications the principle of justification would be left hanging in the air." (RtJ, 57) It is, however, Forst's own philosophical claims that are left hanging in the air without justification. First, to talk of an "insight" here is question-begging: that someone accepts something as a duty does not mean that there is such a duty. That there is would have to be shown, and that people do in fact accept such a duty needs also to be demonstrated.

This is especially so since both claims (that there is such a universal duty and that people accept it) are highly implausible. To give an example: it is hardly likely that a woman faced with a serial murderer about to make her his next victim recognizes his "right to justification" when she shoots him in self-defense. And why should she? She is most certainly not obliged to give him a justification before pulling the trigger. The contrary claim is extremely counter-intuitive, and if Forst thinks otherwise, the burden of proof would be on him.[4] One might object here that Forst claims that moral persons recognize one another in accordance with said duty. However, if this is supposed to imply that moral persons do not and need not recognize immoral persons according to this duty, then this restriction would have to be made explicit, and it would have to enter Forst's formulation of the principle of justification. But of course it does not and it cannot: the principle is supposed to help to "construct" valid moral norms in the first place, but a restriction of "reciprocity" and "generality" to the "values, interests, needs" of moral persons would already presuppose a way to identify moral persons before the principle is even applied. Then, however, the principle or principles underlying this antecedent identification would be the basic principle or principles of morality, not Forst's principle of justification.

But perhaps this is not what Forst means. Maybe he merely means that the woman's "action" must be "based on reasons that cannot be reasonably rejected, given the criteria of reciprocity and generality" (RtJ, 261), so that the woman need not actually give the attacker a justification for her shooting him: her act need only be justifiable to him. However, a further question arises here. Suppose people do initially have a "right to justification": why can't culpable aggressors forfeit this right just as they can forfeit their right to life under some circumstances (or why can't that right be specified in such a way that one does not violate it if one does something that actually could be "generally and reciprocally" rejected by an aggressor?). Forst does not answer this question.

Moreover, Forst's principle of justification with its two attendant criteria of reciprocity and generality is not only implausible but also incoherent. He states:

These two criteria [of reciprocity and generality] taken together confer upon moral persons a basic, if qualified, veto right: the basic right to justification. This veto right is "qualified" in the sense that the moral appeal as "veto" itself must observe the criteria of reciprocity and generality. . . . The advantage of this negative formulation lies in the fact that it makes use of a qualified, instead of a simple, criterion of consensus that allows us to assess the justifiability of different positions in cases of dissent. (RtJ, 214)

True, the well-known disadvantage of a "simple" criterion of consensus, like, for example, Habermas's principles U or D, is that we can hardly expect a consensus among 7 billion people -- who include rapists, dictators, serial killers, child molesters, etc. -- on any norm we find intuitively quite compelling.[5] However, to think that this problem can be solved by simply coming up with a "negative formulation" seems overly optimistic: while it is indeed correct that the serial killer cannot reject with general reasons a norm that would allow his would-be victim to kill him in self-defense, it is also correct that the would-be victim likewise cannot reject with such general reasons (nor, therefore, with general and reciprocal reasons) a norm proposed by the aggressor that prohibits shooting him in self-defense. Their reasons (appealing to their survival) will hardly be shared by the serial killer (who is more concerned with his survival). (Note that neither party can appeal to "moral reasons" that would mysteriously already be "shared" or "general and reciprocal" because what is moral is to be decided in the justificatory discourse in the first place.) But then the aggressor's norm is correct, for "in this context, validity means that no morally significant reasons count against the norm's rightness" (RtJ, 214). (Moral significance refers to the criteria of reciprocity and generality: only reasons that satisfy both criteria are morally significant. Incidentally, if one should for some reason think that an appeal to one's survival is general and reciprocal, then we return again to the original Habermasian problem that hardly any norms can be justified, for in this case both the woman and the murderer can reject the norm proposed by the other. There is simply no escape from this dilemma.) Thus, while Habermas's principles U and D do not justify enough valid moral norms, Forst's "negative formulation" of the "justification principle" justifies too many norms, namely contradicting ones, which shows that the principle must be wrong.[6]

This also has negative implications for Forst's discussion of human rights. He claims that "human rights are those rights which cannot be rejected with reciprocally and generally valid reasons" (JaC, 64).  But if my analysis in the previous paragraph is correct, this would have the embarrassing consequence that the serial killer in my example has a human right not to be killed in self-defense by the woman who will otherwise be murdered by him. (Likewise, genocidal dictators would have a human right that their genocides not be interfered with via humanitarian interventions.)

To be sure, Forst might well deny that my previous analysis is correct. But to support that denial he would have to demonstrate the suitability of his "principle of justification" and of the corresponding "right to justification" in detail and with suitable, concrete, and sufficiently elaborate examples. And, more generally, he would have to actually engage radical critics of discourse ethics. Unfortunately, while Habermas has occasionally done this -- however superficially --  Forst consistently ignores such critics. What Forst's most recent book thus offers us is not a "further development" of his "critical theory," but more of the same.

[1] Rainer Forst, Contexts of Justice: Political Philosophy beyond Liberalism and Communitarianism, trans. John M. M. Farrell (Berkeley: University of California Press, 2002). For a detailed analysis and criticism of Habermas's line of argument, see Uwe Steinhoff, The Philosophy of Jürgen Habermas: A Critical Introduction (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009).

[2] On such distinctions, see ibid., section, as well as my "On the Concept, Function, Scope, and Evaluation of Justification(s)," Argumentation 14 (2000), pp. 79-105.

[3] Rainer Forst, The Right to Justification: Elements of a Constructivist Theory of Justice, trans. Jeffrey Flynn (New York: Columbia University Press, 2012).

[4] For a related example and criticism, see William J. Talbott's review of The Right to Justification in Ethics 123(4) (2013), pp. 750-755, at 754.

[5] For further discussion of this problem and further references, see Steinhoff, The Philosophy of Jürgen Habermas, section 2.3.

[6] Fernando Suárez Müller, in "Justifying the right to justification: An analysis of Rainer Forst's constructivist theory of justice," Philosophy and Social Criticism 39(10) (2013), pp. 1049-1068, esp. 1058-1060, also notes problems with Forst's principle but underestimates their gravity. In particular, he misses the importance of Forst's "negative formulation." Note also that the problem I am pointing out has nothing to do with Hare's famous "fanatical Nazi," nor with any other fanatic. In my example, the problem simply is that the aggressor does not want to die and therefore endorses norms and actions that enjoin others from killing him. There is, however, nothing fanatic about not wanting to die. Finally, it is also mistaken to think that Forst has "merely" the same problem that plagues Scanlon's "criterion" of reasonable rejectability: to wit, it would seem that this latter "criterion," depending on whether one interprets it in a "thin" or a "thick" fashion, either does not imply the desired results or is question-begging. Yet, while Forst might think that his official criterion spells out what reasonableness is, it does not itself appeal to reasonableness: rather, it appeals to reciprocity and generality. However, what is a "thick" notion of reciprocity or of "generality" supposed to be? And what would "thin" ones be? Moreover, my criticism is not merely that the principle implies the wrong results or is question-begging, but that it is incoherent -- and therefore necessarily wrong.