Justification and Emancipation: The Critical Theory of Rainer Forst

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Amy Allen and Eduardo Mendieta (eds.), Justification and Emancipation: The Critical Theory of Rainer Forst, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2019, 198pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780271084787.

Reviewed by William J. Talbott, University of Washington, Seattle


Amy Allen and Eduardo Mendieta have given us a timely and valuable appreciation of, and critical engagement with, the work of Rainer Forst. Forst is one of the leading voices in critical theory, and, in my opinion, the person who has done the most to advance critical theory beyond the work of J├╝rgen Habermas. In this volume, Forst engages with a distinguished group of critics who provide the reader with an appreciation of the importance of Forst's work at the same time as they pose insightful criticisms. The critics address almost all of Forst's most important work. They raise many fascinating and important questions and Forst's replies don't merely repeat previously stated views, but often clarify and extend them.

The book begins with an introduction by Allen and Mendieta in which they situate Forst's work in the tradition of the critical theory of the Frankfurt School and provide a brief overview of Forst's central ideas. The most important idea in Forst's work is the capacity of asking for and providing justifications. For Forst, as for Kant, this is a capacity that, at least on earth, only human beings possess. Following Habermas, Forst socializes the process of justification to require actual dialogue or omnilogue, not merely the interior monologue of a Kantian reasoner. However, whereas Habermas proposed a purely procedural account of morality and justice, Forst's account is grounded in a substantive right and corresponding duty: the right of each human being to a reciprocal and general justification for acts and social structures (including, but not limited to political systems, laws, and other basic social institutions) that affect them, and the corresponding duty of those responsible for actions or social structures that affect them to provide them with a justification for those acts and social structures. Justification is itself a social process with no predetermined goal, except that of finding justifications that are suitably reciprocal and general, which, when they are successful, no participant can reasonably reject.

Forst groups the critics' contributions under three headings, which I will follow here. I hope it is clear that in a review of this length I cannot begin to do justice to the richness of the individual contributions. In my comments, I focus on what seem to me to be some of the most important issues.

1. Justification and Alienation

This topic includes essays by John Christman, Mattias Iser, and Catherine Lu. Although all three write on some aspect of alienation, they discuss very different aspects of it.

Christman presents a well-developed and nuanced account of autonomy and argues that "the intrapersonal demands of autonomy" can alienate us from the "interpersonal demands of justification" (52). Following Christine Korsgaard (The Sources of Normativity), he refers to these intra-personal demands as grounded in our practical identity (42). Then the problem is that unless we identify with the norms that are justified interpersonally, there will be the potential for those norms to alienate us from our practical identity.

For Forst, this is not a problem of a conflict between intrapersonal autonomy and interpersonal justification, because he sees the conflict as a conflict between one's ethical commitments (understood as local commitments of those who share a form of life) and moral autonomy (which involves universal requirements of morality). Forst does not recognize any form of autonomy that is purely intrapersonal. In his reply to Christman, Forst states his view this way:

Neither Christman nor I would want to grant a fascist a valid claim to have his self-justification, ethical commitments, and nonalienated practical identity preserved and respected so that his self-trust will not be damaged by imperatives of mutual justification. If we speak as critical theorists, such identities need to be questioned and decentered, and some process of alienation might be an unavoidable result. (162)

Iser addresses a different potential problem of alienation in Forst's account of toleration. Forst distinguishes three conceptions of toleration: the permission conception, the respect conception, and the esteem conception. Forst himself endorses the respect conception, which only requires that we acknowledge others as moral equals with a right to justification, not that we esteem them or their ways of life or their local cultural or ethical values.

Iser argues that there is something morally wrong with a society in which a majority respects the members of a minority as moral equals, but despises their ethical values and their way of life (59). He uses this kind of example to argue that some amount of esteem toleration is a moral requirement for avoiding injustice (67). But Forst thinks that what is required in Iser's examples is nothing more than respect as moral equals. This does include what Iser calls "accomplishment esteem" (67), because this is necessary to guarantee equal opportunities, which is required by equal respect. "But [accomplishment] esteem -- for example, for certain skills -- is not a form of cultural esteem, such as a particular regard for a particular religion. Nondiscrimination does not call for such cultural esteem" (166).

Christman's and Iser's insightful essays prompted Forst to clarify his views, but not to reconsider them. Lu, raises a challenge that, it seems to me, is deeper. Lu's challenge is based on what she calls "existential alienation" (87). She refers to Jonathan Lear's description of "indigenous peoples whose particular social and moral frames have been disrupted, even rendered inoperable or unintelligible, through colonial settlement, exploitation, genocide, and dispossession" (87).

The reason that I think existential alienation is a deep problem for Forst is that it is not a condition that can easily be rectified by members of the majority culture treating them as equals. A more radical intervention may be required. But what could be the justification for radically intervening? Those who are existentially alienated are far too normatively disabled to be able to take part in a process of mutual justification of the intervention. It would seem that any effective intervention would have to be paternalistic.

The issue raised by existential alienation is a close relative of the issue raised by questions about the proper treatment of children in a just society. Children must be treated paternalistically if they are to develop into adults with the capacities necessary to participate in the process of mutual justification as equals. The duty of care to children or the duty of repair to the existentially alienated cannot be subsumed under the right of justification, because children and the existentially alienated are typically unable to participate in the justificatory process as equals. Forst is quite aware of this problem, because he says that the requirement to develop the capacity for moral autonomy is "the first requirement of justice" (Justification and Critique, 5). The problem for Forst is that this first requirement of justice, though it is presupposed by Forst's right to justification, is an independent requirement that cannot be subsumed by it.

In his reply to Lu, Forst carefully distinguishes between external critique and external intervention (169-170), but he does not directly address Lu's main challenge, which is that there are cases in which external intervention seems required, but cannot be justified to those on whom the intervention is to take place, because, like some indigenous peoples historically, they are too demoralized to be able to participate in the process of mutual justification. Forst seems to miss the problem here, because he seems to regard it as a reductio of Lu's view that it would seem to support, at least in principle, paternalistic intervention from outside (171). The reason that I brought in the example of children is that it seems to me that Lu's objection has it greatest force when some sort of paternalistic intervention from the outside seems to be called for, and the question is how to justify it.

2. Contexts of Power

In this section, Forst discusses the contributions of John P. McCormick and Melissa Yates. McCormick is unclear how to interpret Forst's conception of noumenal power -- roughly, the power to use reasons to alter a person's actions or beliefs in intended ways. When Forst explains that it can involve both agents who provide reasons for an intended action and agents who provide reasons for an intended belief without any corresponding action (e.g., teachers who educate children), then the two of them seem to be in complete agreement (174).

I myself think that both of them make a mistake about punishment. Following Machiavelli and Foucault, McCormick regards all political use of force, including punishment, as treating the victims as objects (104). Forst readily agrees with this position, because on his account of noumenal power, noumenal power operates through reasons. Because the use of force does not involve reasons, Forst describes it as "using others as mere objects" (175). This seems to me to be a mistake. In cases of punishment that is deserved, the punishment can be justified to the person to be punished. Of course, it is unlikely that the person being punished will agree with the justification, but that is true quite generally. The right to justification guarantees the agent a reciprocal and general justification for an act; it does not guarantee them a veto power over what counts as reciprocal and general.

Yates gives Forst lots of credit for opening up the potential for critique with his discussion of contexts of injustice, including transnational contexts of injustice. Then she raises a problem that is related to the problem raised by Lu. She asks about transtemporal justice -- that is, between different generations. Clearly, Forst's account cannot address justice between generations, if they are separated far enough in time that they cannot participate in mutual discourse. The general problem raised by both Yates and Lu is how to understand rights and duties between parties who cannot engage in a process of mutual justification -- either because one party is existentially alienated (Lu) or because the parties live at different times (Yates).

Forst's reply to Yates on this point is less than fully satisfactory. He argues that there is no issue of justice between generations, because an earlier generation cannot dominate a later one if there is no temporal overlap. For Forst, it is definitional that only people and groups who are alive at the same time can dominate one another: "To regard ourselves as being dominated by former agents . . . would, I think, be to blame the wrong people. . . . The exercise of power is a matter of here now" (177). Forst suggests that there may be an imperfect duty not to contribute to future structures of domination (178). Revealingly, he says that this might be a duty that does not exist in "a strictly Kantian framework" (178). I think this is a mistake. The duty could easily exist in a strictly Kantian framework, because, for example, burning fossil fuels to make our lives more enjoyable, at the expense of catastrophic suffering and harm for future generations would never be universalizable, whether or not it was technically a case of domination. What Forst should have said is that such a duty could not exist in a Forstian framework, if there could be no process of mutual justification between the different generations. This seems to me to be a good reason for reconsidering the Forstian framework. It is hard to see a morally relevant difference between performing an act that seriously harms my contemporaries and performing an act on my deathbed that will seriously harm those who are born the day after I die.

3. Critical Universalism

Under this heading, Forst discusses the contributions of Sarah Clark Miller and Allen. I believe that this is the most important topic discussed in the volume, in part because I believe that Forst's contribution to our understanding of normative universalism is one of his most important contributions to moral and political philosophy. Discussions of universalism by critical theorists, among others, can be puzzling if you are not aware of the ground rules for the discussion that are mostly taken for granted, so I quickly review some of them.

Anyone who defends a form of universalism in critical theory is immediately suspected of various sins that taint their position. First, universalism, say, about justice, raises the concern that the universalist is advocating some sort of idealized justice. Idealizations are suspect. I think it should be clear that Forst is not idealizing, because the universals that ground his theory are universals of injustice and oppression. How else are we to express the thought that every moral and religious tradition is a tradition that includes injustice and oppression, except by making use of universal concepts of injustice and oppression? Forst builds his theory of justice as a response to the universality of injustice and oppression. No one could ever accuse Forst of idealizing injustice and oppression.

Second, anyone who defends a form of universalism must explain how they avoid being a foundationalist. All sides agree that foundationalism is a mistake, so if a universalist can be shown to be committed to foundationalism, that is the end of any rational defense of their position. But what is foundationalism? It is typically a combination of a metaphysical and an epistemological doctrine. The metaphysical doctrine is a claim that some principles are universal in a strong sense -- for example, that they apply to all rational beings in all possible worlds. The epistemological doctrine is that we have an infallible method of attaining absolute certainty about these universal principles. Traditionally, the method was some sort of infallible a priori insight into these universal truths.

Foundationalism seemed compelling to philosophers when they thought that they needed some absolutely certain foundations to ground our reasoning. There are still many philosophers who believe this. They are almost all radical skeptics, because it is pretty clear that our beliefs have no such infallible ground.

To avoid foundationalism, as I have articulated it, one need only give up the epistemological part of the doctrine. One can be a thoroughgoing fallibilist about everything and believe that some moral truths are as universal as one likes, without being a foundationalist.

Here we come to the final distinction of importance, the distinction between the immanent and the transcendent -- that is, the distinction between thought that is immanent to a cultural or otherwise defined context, and thought that transcends the particular context in which it is located. In the Enlightenment, the idea of infallible a priori access to universal truth provided an epistemology for transcendent thought, because a priori access would be an avenue to the same universal truths for all rational beings in all possible worlds. To give up on the idea of a priori access seemed to imply giving up on a transcendent point of view. All points of view would be immanent to a particular context.

Habermas's discourse ethics represented a new attempt to articulate how from a particular context, in his terms, from within a particular lifeworld, a process of rational discourse could lead to context-transcending (i.e., life-world transcending) universal norms of morality and justice. Forst has greatly enlarged the Habermasian vision, most prominently by articulating a context-transcending conception of a right to justification and by repeatedly and persuasively showing the self-stultifying consequences of views of morality or justice that deny that context-transcendence is even possible -- that is, views that are committed to one or another variety of moral relativism.

Miller gives an extended appreciation of Forst's work in providing a defense of a kind of universalism that is compatible with the approach of transnational, as opposed to, global feminism (131). She raises two main questions about Forst's theory: (1) how can Forst successfully "navigate the Scylla of relativism and the Charybdis of vices of ideal theory" (139)? (2) how can his theory address the problem of adaptive preferences: "How might Forst respond to those who in some meaningful way wish to reject or forfeit the basic right to justification" (142)?

In response to Miller's first question, Forst distinguishes between universals and idealizations: "There is no reason to suspect that all 'universals' are oppressive and to attribute all the saving power to 'local' forms of life, for that may blind us to the structures of oppression to which they give rise" (179). And he continues: "My approach does not involve an ideal theory but merely relies on a principle of critique that states that no normative order ought to be immune from being questioned as regards the underlying justifications by anyone who is subject to it" (180). In response to Miller's second question, Forst emphasizes that no one can "forfeit" their right to justification; though, sadly, they may fail to recognize that they have such a right and to make use of it (181).

The highlight of the book is the critical dialogue between Allen and Forst. Forst's contribution is "The Justification of Progress and the Progress of Justification," which includes an extensive critical discussion of Allen's book The End of Progress: Decolonizing the Normative Foundations of Critical Theory. In her essay, Allen responds to Forst's criticism. Forst gets the last word in his reply to her criticism.

This is a rich and fertile dialogue that, by itself, is worth the price of the book. In these comments I simply cannot do justice to its richness. Instead, I will briefly comment on some important themes.

(1) Allen on progress. Forst agrees with Allen that neocolonial oppression has often been justified in the name of "progress". But he insists on the importance of distinguishing false progress (moral and political) from true progress, which includes "overcoming false progress" (18). In her essay, Allen distinguishes between progress as fact and progress as an imperative (147). But Forst points to examples of moral and political progress in history as examples in which "marginalized groups (in many countries, first and foremost, women) win participation rights through social struggles" (20-21). If there has been no moral-political progress in the past, how could we ever even think we could bring it about in the future?

Forst's criticism of Allen includes a criticism of her "metanormative contextualism" (End of Progress, 121) as a form of moral relativism (23-24). Allen resists this criticism by defending a kind of immanent or contextual universalism: "In my view, normative commitments that we take to be universal in the scope of their application can be contextually grounded or justified" (149). Allen turns the tables on Forst by claiming: "The opposite of contextualism is therefore not universalism . . . but rather foundationalism" (149).

Since foundationalism is regarded by all parties here as beyond the rational pale, it is incumbent on Forst to parry Allen's objection. He does so by denying that his philosophy requires us to take a "view from nowhere" (184) and by acknowledging the fallibility of human reason (184).

The dialectic between Forst and Allen on this issue leaves the reader with a question for each of them. For Allen, the question is: Allen seems to be trying to combine immanence or contextualism with universalism, but how can it even make sense to hold that universalism could be immanent or contextual? Allen suggests that she can dispel the air of paradox by distinguishing between first-order principles (which may be universal) and her second-order account of their origin and status, which is contextualist (148). This move is reminiscent of John Mackie's distinction between first-order moral judgments and his second-order error theory. Incredibly, Mackie claimed that these first- and second-order moral views are completely independent, even though his second order error theory implied that all of the first-order judgments are false (Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, 16). It is hard to imagine a more consequential connection between first- and second-order claims. For much the same reason, I don't see how Allen's use of the second-order/first-order distinction can help to dispel the air of paradox around her contextualist universalism. We need more explanation.

The question for Forst is the mirror image of the question for Allen. Forst seems to be trying to combine immanence or contextualism with transcendence, but how can it even make sense for transcendence to be immanent or contextual? In my opinion, neither Allen nor Forst has a satisfactory answer to these questions, but they are struggling with them in productive ways. It is a great gift to us, their readers, to be able to witness the struggle.

Although I have only been able to scratch the surface of this rich book, I hope it is clear that it is an important contribution to the literature. I highly recommend it to anyone interested in the work of Forst, or in critical theory, or in moral-political theories of justice, domination, and oppression.