Justification and the Truth-Connection

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Clayton Littlejohn, Justification and the Truth-Connection, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 269pp., $103.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107016125.

Reviewed by Asbjørn Steglich-Petersen, Aarhus University


According to internalists about epistemic justification, the justification of our beliefs can depend only on facts that are in some sense psychologically internal to us -- facts that we can access by reflection or introspection alone. By contrast, externalists hold that justification can depend on external facts as well, such as facts about one's environment or the causal processes responsible for the relevant belief. In his interesting and original new book Justification and the Truth-Connection, Clayton Littlejohn develops and defends a novel externalist account of epistemic justification. The book is unorthodox both in its brand of externalism, and in its argumentative strategy. Littlejohn's brand of externalism is unorthodox -- and likely to be controversial -- mainly in making justification factive, i.e., in requiring justified beliefs to be true. The argumentative strategy is unorthodox in relying to a large extent on the kind of deontological considerations about duties and obligations, usually taken to favor internalism. One of the main contributions of the book is to turn the tables on one of the most common internalist lines of argument, by showing that once properly understood, considerations about epistemic obligations seem to favor externalism instead of internalism.

On a broader level, the book is innovative in systematically relying on normative theorizing to make headway on traditional questions in epistemology, to an extent that is perhaps unrivaled so far in the literature. The book is extremely rich in argument, densely packed with discussion and detailed engagement with the major interlocutors of the field, displaying an impressive command of a very large and diverse literature in epistemology and ethics. As such, the book will be rewarding reading for anyone interested in understanding the nature of epistemic justification, as well as those working at the intersection of epistemology and practical philosophy. In what follows, I can only summarize some of its main points, and will briefly pursue a few possible avenues of criticism.

The long "Introduction" is devoted to outlining some of the main versions of internalism and externalism found in the literature, and assessing the arguments that have shaped the debate between them thus far. The main contention of the chapter is that the debate has reached an impasse, with plausible but not yet compelling arguments on both sides. The introduction unfortunately does not provide a detailed plan of the arguments to be pursued in the book, which would have been useful.

In the second chapter, Littlejohn considers whether considerations having to do with epistemic value might help us decide between internalism and externalism, and argues that they do not. Value-driven arguments for internalism do not ultimately decide the case, since the value considerations they rely on can be accommodated by externalist accounts that incorporate certain internalist elements. But contrary to popular opinion, value considerations also don't favor externalism, according to Littlejohn. Epistemic consequentialists often work their way from a conception of epistemic goods to externalist accounts of justification, but despite his overall aim of defending externalism, Littlejohn rejects that support for the position is to be found here, since he rejects epistemic consequentialism.

In chapters 3 and 4 we find the main arguments for the book's two central claims: that justification is an externalist notion, and that justification is factive. In chapter 3, Littlejohn defends three crucial claims about evidence, and seeks to show how they, given a further assumption, entail that evidence doesn't supervene on internal facts, thus refuting an important version of epistemic internalism. The three claims, to which the majority of the chapter is devoted, are: (i) that evidence consists of propositions (rather than, say, psychological states); (ii) that a proposition can be evidence only if it is true; and (iii) that non-inferential knowledge of a proposition suffices for making it part of one's evidence.

Although many internalists have opposed one or more of these claims, all of them are in principle compatible with internalism, as long as evidential propositions are restricted to appropriately internal ones. The three claims only become troublesome for the internalist on the further assumption of what Littlejohn calls 'liberal foundationalism', namely, that it is possible to have non-inferential knowledge of certain external world propositions, such as the proposition that I have hands. Given this, Littlejohn argues that since my evidence includes the proposition that I have hands, that hands exist in the external world, and that the proposition would be evidence only if I really have hands, my evidence includes facts that go beyond the internal. Are internalists likely to be persuaded by this argument? Perhaps not. As mentioned, the crucial assumption of the argument is that of 'liberal foundationalism', but Littlejohn says little to substantiate this claim beyond the above gloss, thus leaving ample room for interpretation. He assumes that when I have non-inferential knowledge of the proposition that I have hands, my underlying evidence must, simply, be the very proposition that I have hands. But internalists will want to explore other options -- perhaps an internal seeming can provide evidence and thus justification for a belief, without the belief being inferred from it; perhaps my evidence that I have hands is better understood as non-basic, depending on some more basic internal evidence. Littlejohn is aware of these options, but his treatment of them is brief. Internalists will want to hear more.

In the central fourth chapter, Littlejohn turns to defend what is likely to be the most controversial thesis of the book, namely the factivity of justification, i.e., that one can be justified in believing truths only. The basic line of argument is simple: since all justified beliefs can figure in deliberation to justify actions and further beliefs, and false beliefs cannot, only true beliefs can be justified. This basic line is then pursued in two varieties, one concerning the role of justified belief in justifying further beliefs, and one concerning the justification of actions. Both arguments rely on the assumption, defended in the previous chapter, that any justifying reason for a belief or action must be a true proposition. Granted this assumption, it follows immediately that any belief that is justified non-inferentially or by entailing evidence, must itself be true (at least it follows on Littlejohn's construal of non-inferential justification).

But what about beliefs justified by non-entailing evidence, which is normally regarded as the most common case? Here things get murkier. Suppose that you justifiably believe that p on the basis of q, where q does not entail p. Suppose further that if one justifiably believes that p, one could also justifiably believe at least one of p's obvious and competently deduced logical consequences -- a principle Littlejohn calls 'J-Closure'. Suppose, now, that you competently deduce the obvious logical consequence r from p. If this further belief that r is justified, as J-Closure ensures, and we have assumed that any justifying reason responsible for justifying other beliefs must be true, your belief that p must be true, if p is the justifying reason. But how can we conclude from the above that p is indeed your justifying reason? After all, it is compatible with J-Closure that r is justified directly by q, or in some other way, in which case we cannot conclude that p must be true. We know this, according to Littlejohn, because we can imagine an 'epistemic counterpart' that justifiably concludes that r on the basis of p, thus making p the counterpart's justifying reason. And since our justifying reasons are always the same as our counterpart's justifying reasons, we must believe that r on the basis of p as well. And in that case, p must be true. In this way, Littlejohn relies on some apparently innocuous assumptions about the factivity of evidence and the ability of deduction to transmit justification in order to derive the decidedly unpopular thesis that justification is factive.

As was the case with the central argument of chapter 3, however, the overt simplicity of the argument may well belie some much murkier issues. First of all, it is unclear why it wouldn't be just as consistent with the assumptions of the argument to imagine a counterpart whose justifying reason is q instead of p, in which case the argument wouldn't go through. More importantly, it seems that one way or another, the argument must assume a principle that is stronger than J-Closure, namely, that whenever one justifiably believes that p, one could also justifiably believe at least one of p's obvious and competently deduced logical consequences with p as the justifying reason. But critics who are unconvinced of the factivity of justification are likely to object to this principle. If I am justified in believing p on the basis of true but misleading evidence q, I will not necessarily be justified in relying on p in coming to believe any of p's logical consequences, even if I could be justified in believing those consequences directly on the basis of q. If the bloodied glove justifies the false belief that the butler did it, it also justifies believing that the butler or the footman did it, even if the false belief that the butler did it fails to justify anything. So the closure principle necessary for Littlejohn's argument is perhaps not so innocuous after all, and justifying it may well take us into highly contested waters of the debate.

A similar worry can be raised for the chapter's second argument for the factivity of justification, which is based on the role of justified belief in justifying actions. Littlejohn sets up this argument as a six-step proof (p. 168), but we can focus on the inference from the intermediate conclusion (5) and premise (6) to the overall conclusion (7). Suppose we grant (5), namely that 'Only true beliefs can be justifiably included in practical deliberation'. (6) then states that 'A belief cannot be justified if it cannot justifiably be included in the process of practical deliberation'. As I read this statement, it comes down to a necessary condition on the justification of belief: a belief can be justified only if it can justifiably be included in practical deliberation. From (5) and (6) it follows, of course, that (7) 'Only true beliefs can be justified.'

But how plausible is (6), on the clarified reading? It is perhaps telling that in motivating (6), Littlejohn seems to instead focus on standards for when a belief can be justifiably included in deliberation, i.e., the reverse of (6): a belief can be justifiably included in deliberation only if it is justified. This is an immensely plausible and quite popular claim, which might be the reason that relatively little effort is devoted to justifying it. But if that is how we are to understand (6), the conclusion (7) no longer follows. What are the prospects for justifying the version of (6) needed for the argument? Not as good, perhaps, as Littlejohn lets on. The worry is similar to that arising from the apparently innocuous closure principle for justification. If I am to include a belief in practical deliberation, it had better be justified. But if I am justified in believing p on the basis of true but misleading evidence, I will not necessarily be allowed to rely on p in deliberation. This is not to say, of course, that the intended meaning of (6) cannot be supported, but such support is likely to be more controversial than we are told in chapter 4.

In the fifth chapter, Littlejohn seeks to strengthen the case for the factivity of justification by comparing norms for belief with norms for assertion. The guiding thought is that if truth is required for warranted assertion, and common standards govern assertion and belief, truth is required for justified belief as well. A central worry for this strategy is, of course, that truth might be required for assertion and belief not because truth is required for justification, but because knowledge is the common standard, and knowledge, as we know, requires truth. Consequently, the better part of the chapter is devoted to an interesting comparison of the relative virtues of the knowledge norm for belief and assertion with norms more suitable to Littlejohn's agenda.

In the sixth chapter, Littlejohn returns to the role of justified belief in practical deliberation. A recently prominent proposal is that knowledge of a (relevant) proposition is necessary and sufficient for justifiably relying on that proposition in deliberation, but Littlejohn argues that this is too strong, mainly on account of cases in which one is blameless for relying on Gettierized beliefs. Littlejohn then turns to the other possible account, namely that justification for believing a proposition is sufficient for one to justifiably include that proposition in deliberation -- a principle similar to that introduced as premise (6) in chapter 4. Again, the independent support for this principle is brief, but that is not the main purpose of the chapter. Rather, what Littlejohn seeks to show is that the principle is tenable only on the assumption that justification is factive. The argument for this is complicated, and turns on some subtle intuitive differences between justifiable and merely excusable acts, and between blame or mere regret being the most appropriate attitude in certain cases of false belief, which I shall not attempt to summarize here.

In the final seventh chapter, Littlejohn focuses on what normative reasons demand of us in general, in the hope of thereby further motivating his take on epistemic justification. Littlejohn argues that normative reasons demand full conformity and due care to see that we do what's required of us, and armed with this account, Littlejohn turns to justification. Littlejohn thinks of justification as a matter of doing all that the norms governing belief demand, and that we do this if our beliefs conform to the undefeated reasons associated with the norms, and we take due care to make sure of this. This leads Littlejohn to reject both evidentialism and knowledge as the fundamental norm for belief. Instead, Littlejohn argues that the fundamental norm for belief is truth: you ought not believe p unless p is true. If this is the fundamental epistemic norm, we do what the norms require of us, and thereby believe with justification, only if our beliefs are true and we have taken due care to ensure that they are true, which among other things, involves believing it for reasons that show it to be true. As Littlejohn says towards the end of the book, 'it would be nice to have an account of what it takes for something to show someone that something is correct' (p. 241), and indeed it would, particularly if this relation of 'showing' must obtain whenever our beliefs are justified. But it is not easy to identify such an account in the few remaining pages.

Littlejohn's writing is lively and personal for the genre, but not always easy on the reader. At times, more guiding commentary would have helped the reader to follow the dialectics in the very complicated back-and-forths between Littlejohn and various real and hypothetical opponents, and at several crucial junctions, one also gets the feeling that simplified versions of the arguments could have achieved the same result. For these reasons, the book is perhaps most suitable for those who are already well versed in the intricacies of the debate, and less suitable as an introduction to the topic.

The above reservations notwithstanding, the book is in many ways an impressive achievement, and certainly well worth reading. It is not easy to predict whether internalists, or more orthodox externalists, will be won over by Littlejohn's arguments. But they will certainly find in this book a challenging and refreshing new approach to a central debate in epistemology.