Justification as Ignorance: An Essay in Epistemology

Justification As Ignorance An Essay In Epistemology

Sven Rosenkranz, Justification as Ignorance: An Essay in Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2021, 288pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198865636.

Reviewed by Mona Simion, University of Glasgow


Justification is a type of ignorance of a type of ignorance (JaI): this is the main claim defended in Sven Rosenkranz’s new book. On this account, one has propositional justification for p just in case one is in no position to know that one is in no position to know p. In turn, one has doxastic justification just in case one is in no position to know that one does not know p.

The account is knowledge-first, in that it analyses justification in terms of knowledge. It is a knowledge-first internalism, however, in that one’s having justification for believing p, whenever one does, is taken to be ascertainable.

Rosenkranz’s account aligns itself with a trend in recent work in knowledge-first epistemology to develop accounts of justification that are less stringent than the flagship, JB=K account (Williamson 2000), in response to worries of over-demandingness for the latter (see e.g., Brown 2018, Simion et al. 2016, Comesaña 2021, McGlynn 2014, Gerken 2018 for over-demandingness objections, and Bird 2007, Ichikawa 2014, Kelp 2016, Miracchi 2015, Schellenberg 2018, Silva 2017, Simion 2019 for mild knowledge-first views of justification). More precisely, Rosenkranz’s view aligns most closely with internalistically-described such accounts (e.g., Ichikawa 2014, Silva 2017). On Rosenkranz’s view, in order to be in a position to know p, it is necessary to be physically and psychologically capable of knowing p. Being in a position to know that p implies an opportunity to responsively believe that p, which, on Rosenkranz’s view, is causally linked to how things seem to one to be, which, in turn, is informed by what else one believes.

As far as I can tell, two main things differentiate JaI from extant mild knowledge-first accounts:

(1) Negative Valence: JaI differs from its predecessors in that it is a negative account of justification; one is justified in virtue of lacking access to positive epistemic features.

(2) Structural Ambition: JaI’s ambition is wider than that of its predecessors, in that it aims to be an account of both the nature and the logic of justification.

The book is very dense and systematic, and offers excellent arguments throughout. To my mind, it mostly stands out for its ambition to provide both a substantive novel account of justification, and a logic thereof. There is a lot of great material to work through in this book, but due to limited space, in what follows, I will here focus on the credentials of JaI’s Negative Valence and Structural Ambition, and put forth some related worries concerning JaI’s prior plausibility, theoretical fruitfulness, and extensional adequacy.

At first glance, JaI is normatively strange due to Negative Valence: very abstractly, the question that arises is why we should think that one can do normatively well just in virtue of lacking some opportunity for success? Why should we think epistemic justification, or permissibility, has to do with a lack of opportunity to gain knowledge? After all, trees, stones, and furniture lack the relevant opportunities without thereby coming to display much in the way of epistemic normative goodness—and surely not epistemic justification, be it propositional or doxastic.

Even if we restrict the account to human cognizers, the problem persists. Consider:

WISHFUL THINKING: Mary is a wishful thinker. When her partner George spends more and more evening hours at the office, she’s happy that his career is going so well. When he comes home smelling like floral perfume, she thinks to herself: ‘wow, excellent taste in fragrance!’ Finally, when she repeatedly sees him having coffee in town with his colleague Alice, and holding her hand, she is glad he’s making new friends. All in all, it seems to Mary that George is a loving, faithful husband.

Mary is not justified in believing that George is faithful to her: her belief is sourced in wishful thinking and resistant to strong epistemic defeat. Many (most!) externalisms will predict as much. Notably, seemings-based internalisms will struggle: after all, from Mary’s internal perspective, George seems like a loving, faithful husband. Crucially, Mary’s case is hardly an isolated one: it is illustrative of a well-known problem for seemings-based internalism—that of accounting for the epistemic impermissibility of beliefs formed based on seemings with bad etiologies—i.e., sourced in wishful thinking, cognitive penetration, sexism, racism etc. Does Rosenkranz’s view improve on traditional internalism? At first glance, the answer seems to be ‘no’: after all, by stipulation, and on Rosenkranz’s account of what it takes for one to be in a position to know, in virtue of her wishful thinking, Mary is not in a position to know that she is not in a position to know that George is faithful: indeed, she is incapable of knowing this due to it wishfully-seeming to her that George is indeed a faithful husband. JaI, contra intuition, predicts Mary is justified to believe George is a faithful husband. Similarly, one might think, on Rosenkranz’s view, sexists will be justified to believe women are not very smart, racists will be justified to believe people of colour are dangerous, politically motivated reasoners will be justified to believe that climate change isn’t happening, and so on: after all, none of these people can believe the contrary, due to their respective cognitive flaws. In this way, one might think, JaI fails to improve over garden variety seemings-based internalisms.

Furthermore, JaI also seems to compare unfavorably with many—most—competing, externalist knowledge-first views, which give the right result for bad etiology cases: on JB=K, these subjects are not justified because they don’t know; on reliabilist knowledge-first views (Kelp 2016, Miracchi 2015, Simion 2019), for instance, these subjects are not justified because their beliefs are not sourced in knowledge-generating cognitive abilities or processes.

Rosenkranz attempts to shield his account from this worry by idealisation: JaI is not meant as a view of justification simpliciter, but as an account of what it is for a somewhat idealised adult human cognizer to be justified. According to Rosenkranz, the view is meant to apply to

suitably improved versions of ourselves whose epistemic powers finitely [my emphasis] extend our own, who can grasp every thought expressible in the language, and who have other epistemic virtues such as freedom of irrationality, bias and compulsion, freedom of attention deficiencies, and freedom of other ills that affect the epistemic lives of ordinary subjects.

It’s important to note the restriction to ‘finite’ extensions of our epistemic powers: Rosenkranz wants his logic of justification to be idealised enough to be extensionally adequate, while at the same time improving over extant logics by avoiding the commitment to logical omniscience. The question that arises at this point, however, is whether JaI is theoretically interesting as an account of justification and its logic, or rather merely as an account of justification for the logic. To see the worry, note, first, that JaI is bound to have trouble competing on the knowledge-first justification market: its externalist competitors do not require the restrictions that JaI needs for extensional adequacy. In that, one could argue, JaI is not even in the market of competing with extant knowledge-first views, nor with externalist views more generally. Furthermore, JaI does not do much better in comparison with traditional internalisms either: there is every reason to think that traditionalist, seemings-based internalist accounts will be extensionally adequate if idealised to adult, non-biased cognizers: after all, in this way, seemings-based internalism will avoid its main problem, i.e., that of dealing with cases of seemings with bad etiology. Furthermore, traditional internalist views, as opposed to JaI, only need to impose restrictions to non-biased adult cognisers, they do not also require the non-irrationality proviso that JaI takes on board. After all, on traditional internalisms, epistemic justification just is epistemic rationality. In contrast, JaI’s negative valence forces the JaI theorist to impose non-irrationality as an additional requirement: since the account of justification doesn’t feature any epistemic positive value, it needs to posit epistemic positive value as already present in the agents targeted—JaI brings positive epistemic value in via the back door, as it were. In slogan format, ‘There’s no free epistemic lunch!’: positive epistemic value—i.e., epistemic justification—cannot come from the absence of epistemic goods: it requires the presence of good-making features. Since JaI is a negatively valenced account, it cannot stand on its own as an account of justification simpliciter: it requires the epistemic positive value—i.e., rationality—to be already present in the subjects at stake. Otherwise, it is easy to build problem cases in which the reason why one is in no position to know that one does not know is irrationality.

One final word on the prior plausibility of the JaI account of doxastic justification: One (internalist theorist) could wonder whether what this discussion shows is that JaI is, in fact, redundant. After all, one (internalist theorist) could think that all that needs to be added to Rosenkranz’s restrictions to deliver doxastic justification is simply belief: a suitably non-biased, always rational version of myself, one would think, is always justified in their beliefs (note, also, that externalisms about rationality can also deliver a similar result, see Williamson’s 2018).

Last but not least, and setting previous theoretical concerns aside: I worry that JaI also fails straightforwardly on extensional adequacy. To see this, consider Anna, who’s a suitably idealised version of myself, in all things cognitive. Anna is not biased in any way, and always fully rational. Nevertheless, Anna is not omniscient: her cognitive abilities, while much more sophisticated than my own, are still human, limited cognitive abilities. Consider now an extremely long conjunction C, which is just about too long for Anna to be able to entertain. Since she can’t believe C, Anna does not believe C, nor is she in a position to believe it. Since she does not believe C, nor is she in a position to believe it, Anna does not know C, nor is she in a position to know it. Now, here is a principle that strikes me as plausible: if one’s cognitive capacities are too limited to host first-order attitudes with x-content, then they are also too limited to host second-order attitudes about first-order attitudes with x-content. If this is so, and if Anna’s cognitive capacities are too limited to form a belief that C, it follows that Anna’s cognitive capacities are also too limited to entertain second-order thoughts about beliefs with C-contents. If so, Anna is not in a position to know that she doesn’t know that C, nor is she in a position to know that she is not in a position to know that C. On JaI, then, Anna is both propositionally and doxastically justified to believe that C. I take it that this is clearly not the right result. Furthermore, note that this is not merely a bug in extensional adequacy: what the result shows is that JaI also fails in its ambition to offer a logic of non-omniscient justification: after all, the straightforward way out of this problem is to toughen up the restriction and make Anna into an omniscient cognizer.

The task of offering both an extensionally adequate account and a formally sophisticated model for a substantive epistemological category is very ambitious, and bound to encounter some difficulties along the way. In closing, then, I would like to set aside the criticisms raised, and reiterate that this is an impressive book and a must-read for anyone working in epistemology.


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