Justification Without Awareness: A Defense of Epistemic Externalism

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Michael Bergmann, Justification Without Awareness: A Defense of Epistemic Externalism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 266pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199275742.

Reviewed by Richard Fumerton, University of Iowa


In Justification Without Awareness, Bergmann offers both powerful criticisms of various internalist accounts of epistemic justification and a sustained exposition and defense of his own externalist alternative.  It is one of the best books in epistemology that I have read over the past couple of decades and it is a must read for anyone seriously interested in the fundamental metaepistemological debates that dominate contemporary epistemology.

Bergmann begins the book by posing a dilemma for all versions of internalism.  The argument is inspired by the work of Sellars and BonJour (back when BonJour rejected foundationalism).  Bergmann first defines internalism in terms of its commitment to access requirements for justification.  On this version of internalism, one has justification for believing P only when one has access to that which provides the justification.  The access in question, Bergmann argues, can be either doxastic or non-doxastic.  Furthermore, it can be either actual or potential.  The actual and potential doxastic access is understood in terms of actual or potential justified belief that the conditions that constitute justification obtain.  The actual and potential non-doxastic access involves a state (like direct acquaintance, for example) that can relate one to the justifier without one's realizing that (knowing that, having a justified belief that) the state in question is a justifier.  Bergmann argues, powerfully, that doxastic requirements on justificatory states will lead to the kind of regress that inevitably results in extreme skepticism.  Actual doxastic access requirements would require one to have infinitely many ever more complex justified beliefs.  Potential access requirements would require that one be able to form infinitely many ever more complex justified beliefs.

If the fear of regress leads one to abandon a requirement of doxastic access (strong or weak) to justifying states, and one attempts instead to settle for something that is consistent with having no justification for believing that one is in the justificatory state, then, Bergmann argues, one loses the alleged advantage that leads one to embrace internalism in the first place.  If, for example, one can be directly acquainted with the fact that makes true one's belief that P without realizing that it is the fact that makes true one's belief that P, then why would being in that state be any better from an internalist perspective than, for example, being in a belief state caused by the fact that P?

After outlining the dilemma in more abstract terms, Bergmann continues his attack on internalism with a more detailed examination of specific internalists trying to find a path between access requirements that lead to problematic regress and those that land one back in the land of externalism.  He argues, in effect, that there is no viable middle ground.   Bergmann then turns his attention to the thesis of mentalism (a view most closely associated with Conee and Feldman).  The mentalist insists only that one's justification for believing various propositions supervenes on one's mental states.  As just stated, the view remains neutral on the internalism/externalism controversies concerning mental content, and also on the question of whether one should require for justification the problematic access Bergmann discusses in his first two chapters.  Precisely because the mentalist remains neutral on access requirements, however, Bergmann argues that it is a spurious form of internalism unable to capture the intuitions driving paradigmatic internalism.

In the last of his chapters critical of internalism, Bergmann discusses various forms of what he calls deontologism.  Many internalists seem to argue that unless one embraces some form of access internalism one can't do justice to the alleged connection between a belief's being justified and its being a belief one has an epistemic duty to hold or a belief that one is epistemically blameless in holding.  Bergmann argues, relying sometimes on analogies with ethics, that there is no plausible concept of epistemic duty that implies that one's epistemic duties are defined by conditions of which one necessarily has awareness.  While there may be senses in which one is blameless if one is ignorant of one's violation of epistemic duty, that sense of blamelessness is irrelevant to the plausibility of an analysis of epistemically justified belief.

In Part II of his book, Bergmann presents and defends the version of externalism he takes to be most plausible.  His account is a variation on Plantinga's proper function account of warrant (where warrant is understood as that which when added to true belief yields knowledge).  But Bergmann is analyzing epistemic justification.  The rough idea, according to Bergmann, is that "S's belief B is justified iff i) S does not take B to be defeated and ii) the cognitive faculties producing B are a) functioning properly, b) truth-aimed and c) reliable in the environments for which they were 'designed.'" (135).  There is, to my way of thinking, surprisingly little discussion of how precisely to understand talk of function or design.  Presumably, we are invited to understand this critical concept however it seems to us most plausible.  Theists will presumably go for a concept of design familiar through thinking about artifacts.  "Naturalists" sympathetic to Bergmann's approach will work on developing a concept of design defined in terms of evolutionary selection.

It is important to realize that Bergmann's analysis of justification is not a version of reliabilism.  We might all presently be the victims of demonic machination and that malevolent demon might continue to cause false belief indefinitely into the future.  Yet if our massively false beliefs are produced by a cognitive mechanism that was originally designed for truth and that was reliable in the (demon-free) environment for which it was designed, those massively false beliefs will still be justified.  Since the new evil demon problem has always plagued reliabilists -- Goldman himself never seemed all that comfortable with any of his proposed solutions to the problem -- Bergmann naturally proposes this feature of his account as one of its virtues.

The remainder of the book is largely an effort to trace out the consequences of his proper function account of justification and to respond to various objections.  I'll discuss some of those responses in the critical evaluation of Bergmann's views that follows.

Critical Evaluation

(1)  Access Internalism

Bergmann's criticisms of access internalism are powerful.  Indeed, he will surely convince almost everyone that one should approach access requirements on justification with the greatest of care.  As Bergmann points out, regress rears its ugly head when the relevant access is construed in terms of propositional knowledge or justified belief that relevant conditions of justification obtain.  And if one retreats to non-propositional awareness, one must guard against embracing a form of internalism that renders possessing justification no more "intellectually satisfying" than having a reliably produced belief (or having a belief resulting from a properly functioning belief-producing process).  In a relatively brief review of this sort I can't resist using my own view as an example of how to avoid the dilemma Bergmann wants to propose for internalists (though I'll restrict my comments to noninferential justification).  On my view, one's belief that P is noninferentially justified when one has the thought that P while one is directly acquainted both with the fact that P (the truth-maker for the thought) and with the correspondence that holds between the thought and the fact.  Direct acquaintance is not a belief state nor is it a form of propositional knowledge.  But when one has "before one's mind" everything relevant to the truth of one's thought, one has knowledge -- one has the best sort of knowledge it is possible to have.  One feels no need to seek higher-level knowledge of one's knowledge in order to gain more satisfying first-level knowledge.  While it is usually possible to get the relevant meta-knowledge, gaining it does nothing to enhance the epistemic assurance one already has when confronting both the truth maker, the truth bearer and the relation of correspondence that defines truth.  The view is not a form of access internalism.  It does not require of the noninferential justification one possesses that one has any sort of access to that noninferential justification. 

Bergmann does point out that if one allows that one can have noninferentially justified false belief (perhaps by being acquainted with a fact similar to but different from the truth maker for one's belief) one should feel the same sort of dissatisfaction with this "externalist" version of internalism that one feels when one contemplates the fact that on a reliabilist account of justification one can be unable to distinguish between reliably and unreliably formed  belief.  That might be a strong argument for restricting noninferential justification to situations in which one is aware of the relevant truth-maker.  But even without such a move, there is surely an enormous difference between the intellectual satisfaction one achieves when confronting actual or near correspondence between truth-bearers and truth-makers and being in a belief state that may or may not have the relevant causal pedigree.  These "good" and "bad" cases, while phenomenologically indistinguishable, need be nothing like each other.

(2) Justification and Proper Function

As noted above, Bergmann allows that it is possible that most justified beliefs are false.  One can find oneself removed (permanently) from the truth-conducive environment in which one's cognitive mechanisms were formed (designed).  Whether this feature of the view deals with the new evil demon problem is unclear, however.  It still follows, on Bergmann's view, that if one were designed by an evil demon to form false beliefs about one's environment where such beliefs are caused by the very sensory evidence that moves us to form beliefs about our environment, then such beliefs would be epistemically unjustified.  And many internalists will, no doubt, still take this to be a serious problem for the view.  In the final analysis, the issue really turns on whether or not internal states like sensations necessarily or only contingently play their epistemic role.  Extreme internalists are convinced that it is a necessary truth that two cognizers in the same internal states have the same justified beliefs.  There is no possible world in which my internal duplicate has unjustified belief where I have justified belief.  Bergmann realizes how pivotal this claim is and discusses it at some length (118-130).  I can't do justice to the intricacies of Bergmann's discussion, but it is interesting to note that he does concede that there may be necessary connections between the phenomenal character of some sensations and the appropriateness of the beliefs those sensations prompt.  Specifically, he seems to concede that there is a plausible primary/secondary quality distinction and that beliefs about the secondary properties of physical objects have a content conceptually tied to the phenomenal character of sensation.  That conceptual connection might naturally translate into a critical (and non-contingent) epistemic role played by the relevant sensations.  So, for example, Bergmann concedes that it may well be that the very concept of being sour involves reference to the familiar phenomenal sour taste sensation that we get when we bite into, for example, a lemon.  If we restrict our thought to such examples, Bergmann might concede, the internalist thesis that a sour taste sensation is a "sign" of the sourness of an object might seem quite plausible.  But, he goes on to argue, there is no such connection between the qualitative character of sensation and the intentional content of beliefs about the primary qualities of physical objects.  We can easily imagine a world in which the sensation of smoothness gives rises to a judgment about the roughness of an object, or olfactory sensation gives rise to a judgment about shape.  Furthermore, we can imagine a world in which we have evolved in such a way that the relevant dispositions to form belief were formed in an environment in which they are truth-aimed and truth-conducive in just the way required for them to be justified.

In the final analysis, I suspect that Bergmann is right that the plausibility of the extreme internalists' intuitions relies on their collapsing the primary/secondary quality distinction that Bergmann wants to make between two roles phenomenal experience plays: securing the content and securing the epistemic status of beliefs about the properties of external objects.  I think Bergmann's argument fails because, like Berkeley, I think that all of our understanding of physical objects and their properties is ultimately parasitic upon our grasp of phenomenal appearance.  As Bergmann insightfully realizes, a good part of the internalism/externalism controversy in epistemology ultimately has its roots in a much older metaphysical controversy concerning the nature of thought about the external world.  And before leaving this point, I should perhaps concede that Bergmann is unlikely to be overly concerned that his defense of externalism rests on rejecting the extreme empiricist view that all thought of physical reality is parasitic upon thought of phenomenal appearance.  I'm sure his view will be that if a defense of internalism requires that, then so much the worse for internalism.

You will have noticed that Bergmann's conditions for justified belief specifically require that to be justified in believing P one must not believe that there are defeaters for one's justification.  He is well aware that many will wonder why the mere existence of belief in a defeater (no matter how irrational that belief might be) precludes epistemic justification.  Although he tries hard to make the view plausible, it remains one of the most contentious issues in the book.  If unjustified belief does nothing to justify conclusions based on it, why should unjustified belief destroy justification?  I also wonder if a little philosophical sophistication can't introduce into one's doxastic system the relevant defeaters.  When I contemplate the fact that I have no metajustification and no way of getting metajustification for believing that a belief of mine is reliably produced, for example, that fact seems to me to be a relevant defeater for the belief.  But, of course, that is just a way of emphasizing the internalist's conviction that the pedigree of a belief, when one has no way of discovering that pedigree, can't get one any interesting sort of justification.  Again, that is not to suggest that one should embrace the kind of access requirements that lead to regress.  It is, rather, to suggest a way of testing proposed accounts of justification.  When satisfying X without having any way of discovering that fact leaves one no more assured of the truth of one's belief that p, that is a sure sign that one shouldn't have identified satisfying X with having (interesting) epistemic justification for believing p.  I remain convinced that all externalist accounts of justification fail this test.


It is in the nature of a critical review that one criticizes.  I disagree with Bergmann's conclusions on a host of fundamental issues, but there are very few critics of internalism whose work I respect more than his.