Placeholder book cover

Paul Guyer, Kant, Routledge, 2006, 439pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415283361.

Reviewed by Helga Varden, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


Kant is an introductory book to all of Kant's philosophy. Such a project requires not only intimate knowledge of the entire body of Kant's writings, as well as his key interlocutors and interpreters, but also an ability to present the core philosophical questions Kant was concerned with in a compressed, and yet intelligible manner for an audience new to philosophy. Paul Guyer is one of the few philosophers who can take on such a huge task, and to have accomplished it in a mere four hundred pages is simply impressive. There is no doubt that this book will be of invaluable help to those who are striving to understand Kant's philosophy, including its place in the history of philosophy and its role as a source of inspiration for contemporary philosophy.

Kant is an excellent introduction to Kant's philosophy. Guyer succeeds in treating comprehensively all the issues important to Kant scholarship without either oversimplifying or masking the richness of Kant's thought. But as is customary in critical reviews I will focus more on some of the aspects of the work I find problematic. My remarks are divided into two parts. In the first part, I will consider the book as it attempts to fulfill its role as an introductory text to Kant's philosophy. In my view, Kant reads more like an introduction to Guyer's interpretation of Kant than -- as we might say -- a "non-partisan" introduction to Kant. This makes it hard for readers to appreciate the complexity and strengths of the various interpretations of Kant. Nevertheless, the references given in endnotes and the suggestions for further reading provide the reader with ample resources for additional research. The one chapter where I find that Guyer does not do this is his chapter on Kant's 'Doctrine of Right' and, since some of the alternative interpretations claim to overcome the tensions internal to Guyer's interpretation, omitting them comes at a price. For that reason, in the second part, I will focus my attention on Guyer's treatment of Kant's philosophy of right.

Kant is part of a new philosophical series published by Routledge. This new series, Routledge informs us, should 'provide an ideal starting point for those new to philosophy' in that each of the books 'places a major philosopher … in historical context, explains and assesses their key arguments, and considers their legacy' (ii). After an introduction, in which he gives us a brief overview of Kant's intellectual development, Guyer sets out to accomplish the task of situating and evaluating Kant's philosophical work. Naturally, he divides it into three main parts. The three parts are labelled 'Nature', 'Freedom' and 'Nature and Freedom', roughly corresponding to the Critique of Pure Reason, the Critique of Practical Reason, and the Critique of Judgement. Hence, all Kant's writings on theoretical philosophy are described and assessed in the first part ('Nature'), his writings on practical philosophy, including religion, are found in the second part ('Freedom'), and his writings on aesthetics and history are found in the final part ('Nature and Freedom'). Throughout, Guyer emphasizes that 'Kant's position' is not a unified, coherent position. Instead, Kant's position is presented as having been continuously developed and revised in response to questions posed by Kant himself and his interlocutors. Moreover, Kant's positive, philosophical argumentation in support of his project of transcendental idealism is seen as overall unsuccessful. According to Guyer, the 'legacy' of Kant is therefore not so much his philosophical position as a whole. Rather Kant's legacy should be seen to consist partly in his successful refutation of philosophers before him, especially in his critique of traditional metaphysics, and partly in those elements of his theory that can be incorporated into philosophical positions antithetical to transcendental idealism.

Since this book is intended as an introduction, Guyer's aim is not to make significant and groundbreaking contributions to Kant research. Hence, my critical engagement concerns his success in giving new readers of philosophy a good introduction to Kant. As mentioned above, Guyer's book is a wonderful contribution to the introductory literature on Kant. The predominance of Guyer's interpretation of Kant over other strong alternatives is, however, characteristic of the book as a whole, and since it is especially clear in the first chapter ('Kant's Copernican Revolution'), I will use this chapter to illustrate the more general point.

This first and by far the longest chapter in the book is dedicated to Kant's defense of transcendental idealism in the Critique of Pure Reason -- or rather, by Guyer's lights, the failure of that defense. Guyer starts by giving a brief introduction to the main task of the first Critique, namely Kant's project of transcendental idealism, which requires demonstrating the possibility of synthetic a priori judgements. Here Guyer gives a clear and most useful introduction to the main concepts necessary to understand this task. These include a priori and a posteriori cognitions, analytic and synthetic judgements, as well as an explanation of the historical context within which Kant was writing and to which he was responding. Guyer then quickly proceeds to the evaluation of the success of Kant's arguments concerning his theory of sensibility (space and time), his theory of the understanding, the transcendental deduction, the principles of empirical judgment, and his refutation of idealism. Since this critical engagement is primarily Guyer's interpretation, it is not surprising to the more experienced readers who know Guyer's work that Guyer finds most of Kant's arguments to be either lacking or faulty and those he deems more promising not to entail transcendental idealism. Rather, the surprise here is the lack of attention to alternative readings of Kant, which are less pessimistic about the success of Kant's positive views.[1] As it is, readers must look up the secondary literature given in the endnotes or in the list of further reading to find alternative readings and objections to Guyer's interpretation. The one place where Guyer gives some voice to alternative interpretations comes after his own interpretation of Kant's theory of sensibility. After a fifteen page description and refutation of Kant's theory of space and time, Guyer briefly notes that Henry Allison and Rae Langton interpret Kant differently. But the problem is that Guyer gives the reader little real help or insight in appreciating the strength of these other interpretations (pp. 67ff). Since Guyer is one of the most well-versed persons in the secondary literature on Kant's first Critique as well as in the history of philosophy today, readers would benefit tremendously by a discussion of his own interpretation as set against the interpretations of others -- or at least against the most received competing view, thereby revealing the (perceived) weaknesses and strengths of both. Of course, such a presentation is fully compatible with Guyer ending up defending his as the strongest interpretation -- that would just be a bonus -- but without benefit of a proper consideration of the competition, readers are unable to appreciate the strength of Guyer's interpretation.

None of the above undermines the fact that Guyer, as a general rule, supplies each chapter with a rich list of secondary references accompanied by an accurate, albeit brief, description of them. The one place where I think that Guyer's introduction to Kant is less accurate concerns his chapter on Kant's 'Doctrine of Right'. In this chapter, Guyer draws no major distinctions between different interpretive approaches to Kant's texts in political and legal philosophy either in the text itself, in his endnotes or in his advice on further reading. Moreover, since there is one line of interpretation that claims to solve some of the tensions inherent in Guyer's interpretation of the 'Doctrine of Right', a fair consideration of it might prove especially useful to readers.

Historically, very little attention has been paid to the 'Doctrine of Right'. It seems reasonable to believe that its relative inaccessibility even to Kantians is a major explanatory factor here. But equally important seem to be two other features of Kant's account. First, Kant appears to have little sympathy for redistribution in response even to extreme need. Second, Kant seems to have a lot of sympathy for Hobbes's argument that considerations of prudence in response to the inconveniences of the state of nature not only make it permissible to force persons to become subjects to state authority, but actually are sufficient to force people to yield even to an absolutist sovereign.[2] For the longest time, Kant's philosophy of right was therefore seen either as a rather cruel account that was best left alone or something from which a main lesson to be learnt was what not to argue.[3] In light of this general view, it is not surprising that the first Kantian-inspired philosophers attempting to develop a Kantian theory of justice typically argued that Kant's own theory of right required some fundamental reformulation in order to yield a fruitful Kantian theory of justice.[4] A major aim was to overcome the alleged problems of lack of sensitivity to considerations of need and an excess sensitivity to the plausibility of absolutism. For example, John Rawls (1999) and Onora O'Neill (2000) argued that had Kant adopted a weak version of voluntarism he could have avoided these problems. As liberals, they could not accept Kant's presumed absolutism, since it makes right into might. So, instead, they proposed that individuals' rights should set the boundaries for rightful use of state coercion. Moreover, they argued that these individual rights should include a right to cover certain basic needs and be subject to fair rules of co-operation. In this way they replaced what they viewed to be Kant's absolutism with what they considered to be the better interpretation of his position, namely a weak voluntarism sensitive to need and considerations of fairness. The upshot of this reformulation of Kant's view is that rightful use of coercion is understood in terms of rational hypothetical consent to act within a framework fundamentally set by individuals' rights.

Recently, these earlier interpretations of Kant's political philosophy have been significantly challenged, and it may be fair to say that there are currently three main lines of interpretation. First, Howard Williams has recently argued that there are profound differences between Kant and Hobbes -- most importantly concerning the need for the state. Williams argues that Kant's main argument for the necessity of the state is a concern for assurance. The provision of assurance is a moral response to human beings' typical tendencies to act viciously, rather than, as Hobbes argues, merely a prudential response to those same tendencies.[5] The second interpretive line argues that Kant actually defends a weak version of voluntarism. Guyer's earlier text on Kant's philosophy of right would be included in this group.[6] Finally, we find a third group of interpreters who argue that Kant's assurance argument is not the only reason for the necessity of the state. Instead, they suggest that problems of indeterminacy concerning the application of the Universal Principle of Right with regard to property (private right) yield independent and equally important reasons for the necessity of the state.[7] If, for the sake of simplicity, we label the first group as fundamentally inspired by Hobbes in their Kant interpretations, and the second as fundamentally inspired by Locke, then the third group can be said to be fundamentally inspired by Rousseau. More specifically, the third group sees Rousseau's conception of the general will as having a much greater influence over Kant than either Hobbes or Locke.

One main difference between the first group's 'Hobbesian' and the second group's 'Lockean' interpretation lies in the first group's insistence that Kant held there to be no restriction on rightful use of sovereign power. This entails that the Hobbesian interpretations, in contrast to the Lockean interpretations, argue that considerations of hypothetical consent cannot undermine the sovereign's right to rule. One main contrast between the Hobbesian and the 'Rousseauean' interpretations lies in the latter group's reluctance to attribute absolutism to Kant's position at all. Nevertheless, the Rousseauean interpretations are equally against the 'Lockean' view that Kant's theory of right is a weak voluntarist account, in which the rights of the state are in principle reducible to those of individuals in the state of nature. These differences among the three main interpretive lines seem to boil down to the question whether Kant should be read to be embracing voluntarism, and if so, then how is this compatible with absolutism, and if not, then must Kant be an absolutist?

Of course, it is beyond the scope of this commentary to argue for the plausibility of any of these interpretations. Instead, I only want to note two things. First, Guyer's interpretation in Kant appears to be a combination of the 'Hobbesian' and the 'Lockean' lines of interpretation.[8] Consequently, his interpretation attempts to reconcile two apparently incompatible elements, namely weak voluntarism and absolutism, in the same account. On the one hand, Guyer argues along the same line as Williams when he emphasizes that, on Kant's account, assurance provides a moral argument for the necessity of the state. Since we are typically immoral, Guyer sees Kant arguing, we have a moral obligation to provide assurance that we will respect one another's property rights. And since assurance can only be provided by a powerful state, we must enter civil society (pp. 265, 272f, 301). Moreover, Guyer also affirms a Hobbesian reading of Kant in his view that Kant sees the people as politically obliged even to brutal sovereigns like dictators (293, cf. 284-288). On the other hand, Guyer shifts to a 'Lockean' interpretation when he argues that hypothetical consent plays a crucial role in determining the content of property rights, namely what individuals have enforceable rights to. In sum, Guyer presents Kant as being both an absolutist and as holding hypothetical consent to play a critical role when determining the rightful limits on state coercion.[9]

Combining these two elements in one interpretation entails that Kant's account is fundamentally in tension with itself. That is, it seems that either Kant must argue for the absolutist conception of political legitimacy or he must accept that rightful use of state coercion must be in line with individuals' enforceable rights.[10] He can't have his cake and eat it too. And indeed, Guyer seems to come to this conclusion, which moves him to argue that hypothetical consent must be given priority in the better interpretation of Kant's account. Nevertheless, if the interpretation ends up attributing a fundamentally inconsistent theory to Kant, then there is a good reason to charitably explore the plausibility of the third line of interpretation. And indeed, part of the alleged merit of the Rousseuean interpretations is that they can avoid attributing this inconsistency to Kant, which suggests that they may provide a better reading of Kant's theory of justice. Therefore, omitting a consideration of one of the main lines of Kant interpretation comes at a considerable cost in an introductory text on Kant's theory of right.

[1] It is also slightly surprising that Guyer has adopted a writing style similar to Kant's own. His sentences are typically long, often ranging from ten to fifteen lines in length, and his use of subclauses within individual sentences results in a great deal of syntactical complexity. The choice of this more 'German' style of writing is surprising not only because the book is written primarily for an Anglo-Saxon audience, but also because students new to Kant typically complain that his complex style of writing renders the text even more difficult to understand.

[2] Variations on this view are found in, for example, Jeffrie G. Murphy's Kant: The Philosophy of Right, Mercer University Press: Macon, ROSE-edition, 1994; Onora O'Neill, Bounds of Justice, Cambridge University Press, 2000; Howard Williams's Kant's Political Philosophy, St. Martin's Press: New York, 1983.

[3] For example, Hannah Arendt, Lectures on Kant's Political Philosophy, edited by Ronald Beiner, University of Chicago Press, 1992, pp. 7, 9, 19, 21, 30f, found the work as a whole utterly incomprehensible and the individual arguments one can make sense of unconvincing. She suggests that Kant's various political writings should be considered fragments written by an aging philosopher who 'no longer had either the strength or the time to work out his own' political philosophy Similarly, Allen Rosen, Kant's Theory of Justice, Cornell University Press, 1993, p. viii, makes it a fundamental premise of his interpretation that when approaching Kant's philosophy of right it is important to be 'keenly aware of … [Kant's] limitations [not only] as a writer … [but also as a] political philosopher'.

[4] These reformulations often utilized arguments found in other parts of Kant's philosophy to overcome the problems supposed in Kant's writings on legal and political philosophy. For example, Arendt made use of Kant's Critique of Judgement, John Rawls drew mainly upon the Groundwork, and Onora O'Neill turned especially to the 'Doctrine of Virtue'.

[5] See Howard Williams's Kant's Critique of Hobbes, University of Wales Press, 2003. In his earlier work, referenced above, Williams argues that Kant's argument for the need for the state is a straightforward prudence argument. In my view, Williams's new assurance argument remains a prudence argument, but engaging this issue is beyond the scope of this review.

[6] Paul Guyer, Kant on Freedom, Law, and Happiness, Cambridge University Press, 2000. A weak voluntarist interpretation of Kant is also found in the works of Alexander Kaufman, Welfare in the Kantian State, Oxford University Press, 1999 and Patrick Riley, Will and Political Legitimacy. A Critical Exposition of Social Contract Theory in Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, Kant, and Hegel, Harvard University Press, 1999.

[7] For example, I consider the work of Katrin Flikschuh, Kant and Modern Political Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2000, Ottfried Höffe, Immanuel Kant, translated by Marshall Farrier, State University of New York Press, 1994, Bernd Ludwig, 'Whence Public Right?', in Kant's Metaphysics of Morals, edited by M. Timmons, Oxford University Press, 2002, 159-184, Arthur Ripstein 'Authority and Coercion', in Philosophy and Public Affairs, 32: 2-35, 2004, Helga Varden, 'Kant and Dependency Relations: Kant's Justification on the State's Right to Redistribute Resources to Protect the Rights of Dependents', in Dialogue XLV, 2006, 257-84, and Ernest J. Weinrib, 'Law as Idea of Reason', in Essays on Kant's Political Philosophy, edited by H. L. Williams, University of Chicago Press: Chicago, 1992, 15-49, as belonging to this third category.

[8] The only apparent similarity between Guyer's account and the 'Rousseauean' line of interpretation lies in the fact that Guyer also pays quite a lot of attention to Kant's accounts of private and public right in the 'Doctrine of Right'. This is a feature to which the Hobbesian and Lockean accounts typically do not pay a lot of attention to, including Guyer's earlier account (2000). Nevertheless, I see Guyer's view as distinctly Lockean, since it is fundamentally informed by the weak voluntarist assumption of hypothetical consent rather than the Rousseauean concept of the general will.

[9] To give one example, Guyer explains that 'property can be rightfully acquired only in ways that are consistent with the innate right of all who will be affected by such claims, that is to say, only on terms to which they could rationally consent' (p. 268, cf. 281). More specifically, Guyer argues that the Universal Principle of Right determines what persons can rationally consent to and on his interpretation of the principle, 'each person must have the maximal sphere of freedom consistent with the similar maximal freedom of everyone else' (p. 263). In the case of private property, this entails that rightful appropriation involves 'taking control of an external object … if so doing leaves others equally free to take control of relevantly similar objects as well' (p. ibid., cf. 272). When Guyer combines this point with his view concerning the general importance of assurance in Kant's 'Doctrine of Right', he concludes on p. 274 that

In fact, Kant argues that our duty to enter into the civil condition with others gives us the right to coerce them into entering that condition with us, since their refusal to do so would be equivalent to a threat against our property claims … we have the responsibility even prior to … a well-functioning state to make only property claims that could be fairly enforced against others and to coerce them only into a state that would maintain a fair system of property rights. The duty to institute a state based on a fair distribution of property rights is thus for Kant our primary political responsibility.

There are many puzzles in this interpretation, but let me mention two important ones. For example, the Universal Principle of Right makes no mention of 'maximizing' freedom. Moreover, if Kant really believed that his account entailed such a Lockean kind of proviso on appropriation of private property, it is textually peculiar that he does not say so (since, as Guyer points out on p. 269, he explicitly rejects Locke's labour account). Indeed, proposing this proviso makes Guyer's account even more Lockean that he acknowledges -- presumably in part because he wrongly describes Locke as proposing the proviso as a prudential rather than (correctly) as a moral restriction upon the appropriation of private property (p. 271). (Interpreting the Lockean proviso as a moral -- and not merely a prudential -- restriction seems to be the standard interpretation. It is affirmed by Locke interpreters such as A. John Simmons in The Lockean Theory of Rights, Princeton University Press, 1992, and Gopal Sreenivasan in The Limits of Lockean Rights in Property, Oxford University Press, 1995.)

[10] We see some of this tension quite clearly in Guyer's text. For example, Guyer defines private right as 'the rights and duties people must observe in their interactions with each other in order to preserve equally maximal spheres of freedom', whereas public right is 'the mechanism by which people can and must collectively enforce those rights and duties' (265f). If this is so, then there is no principled reason why we need the state once we assume away the typical viciousness of human beings. And in the case of a brutal sovereign, at least under empirical circumstances in which people by and large act within their rights, anarchy must be preferable. The question of rebellion, then, should be answered by a probabilistic calculation as to which response (rebellion and anarchy or acceptance and despotism) leads to the most in/justice. When truly oppressive regimes are in place, the probabilistic calculation must favour revolt rather than, as Kant seems to argue, submission. Not surprisingly, this is precisely the reason Guyer rejects Kant's view that rebellion is always wrong (288). Another feature of Kant's text hard for Guyer to reconcile is Kant's apparent affirmation of the freedom of speech. Again, this feature is easily reconcilable with the hypothetical consent aspect of Guyer's interpretation, but not with the absolutist aspect. If Kant is an absolutist, then how can freedom of speech be a condition for political legitimacy?