Kant and Applied Ethics: The Uses and Limits of Kant's Practical Philosophy

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Matthew C. Altman, Kant and Applied Ethics: The Uses and Limits of Kant's Practical Philosophy, Wiley-Blackwell, 2011, 320pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780470657669.

Reviewed by Jonathan Peterson, Loyola University New Orleans


Kant and Applied Ethics is an ambitious attempt to assess the success of Kant's moral theory in the field of applied ethics. The book defends Kantian answers to a number of central questions in applied ethics but it also raises objections to Kant's ethical theory. The book is not an "attempt to establish Kantian ethics and political theory incontrovertibly from the ground up (p. 140)." Nor does it aim to show that Kant's theory can adequately handle all the important questions in applied ethics. Altman writes that a major purpose of the book is to defend Kant "as far as he can be defended and no further (p. 8)." Altman wants to preserve a central place for Kantian notions of dignity, rational agency and categorical moral principle within applied ethics, but does not want to claim that Kant's a priori account of morality can do all of the work that we need ethical theories to do. Altman points out that "we must be careful not to make [Kant] say what we wish he would have said (p. 287)." Accordingly the book often takes seriously some of the less attractive passages in Kant's moral texts that seem to represent a parochial eighteenth-century worldview.

The book ranges widely across the central problems of applied ethics. It divides into three parts. In the first part, Altman argues that Kant's ethics provides successful accounts of important issues in environmental ethics and bioethics. In Chapter 1, Altman argues that we have obligations to be concerned for the well-being of animals because cruelty or indifference to the suffering of animals corrupts our character and makes us more likely to be cruel to human rational agents. In Chapter 2, he argues that we have duties to protect and restore the natural environment because the well-being of human rational agents (including future generations) depends on it and because the appreciation of nature helps us to develop a virtuous character. In Chapter 3, he argues for publicly-provided healthcare, and in Chapter 4 he explores a Kantian account of the value of patient autonomy in bioethics. Altman argues that there are limits on patient choice that arise from the value of autonomy itself. He claims that physician-assisted suicide is immoral on the grounds that suicide violates a patient's duty to herself. Similarly, he argues that it is wrong for a rational person to refuse treatment in instances where that involves allowing herself to die. Finally in this chapter he argues for a duty to donate one's organs based in a duty of beneficence.

In the second part of the book (Chapters 5-6), Altman argues that Kant's ethical theory has different implications than Kant himself thought for two important moral issues: capital punishment and marriage. Altman argues that despite Kant's claim that murderers must be put to death, we could not will a law according to which it is possible for an innocent person to be put to death. Altman argues that Kant's account of sexuality and marriage implies that we ought to accord marriage rights to same-sex couples.

In the final part of the book, Altman advances four criticisms of Kant's ethics. In Chapter 7, he criticizes Kant's account of autonomy and choice, arguing that Kant ignores the way in which background social and economic conditions shape our options and affect our responsibility for our choices. In Chapter 8, he argues that Kant's account of moral judgment takes insufficient account of the historical and social conditions that shape our understanding of what it is reasonable to do. Chapter 9 addresses the problem of collective responsibility, arguing that Kant has no way of holding corporations morally responsible for their actions. In Chapter 10, he argues that Kant's conception of personhood is too restrictive to allow us to adequately think through the question of the moral status of abortion. The basic thrust of these four chapters is to argue that an a priori approach to ethics such as Kant's is fundamentally inadequate. The book concludes with a short chapter in which Altman suggests that a form of Hegelian communitarianism may prove better able to handle these issues of choice, judgment, collective responsibility, and personhood than a purely Kantian theory can.

It is possibly an inevitable weakness of a book that covers so much ground that some of its conclusions do not seem to be fully defended. For example, in the short chapter on health care, Altman argues that the duty of beneficence requires that we provide people with access to medical assistance (p. 74), that the government ought to provide health care to the poor (p. 80), and that the duty to work towards perpetual peace supports a duty to promote the health of people beyond our borders (p. 83). This is a lot of ground to cover in one chapter and some of the arguments for these claims require more defense. For example, in supporting the claim that government ought to provide health care to the poor, Altman argues against a libertarian reading of Kant's political philosophy. This is plausible, but the points Altman makes will hardly be convincing to someone sympathetic to libertarianism (see pp. 77-80).

A similar point could be made about Altman's argument against physician-assisted suicide. Altman claims, for example, that "the terminally ill patient who chooses to die tacitly commits himself to the idea that the value of his life depends on how much pain or pleasure he experiences (p. 95)." This might not be true, since, as Altman recognizes, the patient who chooses to die may be concerned with dignity rather than pain. However, even in those cases where pain is an issue, the claim is contentious. If Altman is claiming that choosing suicide commits me to the claim that the value of my life depends only on how much pain or pleasure I experience, it is not clear that this is so. I might think that the value of my continuing life as a rational agent is important but that this value is outweighed by the pain in this case. If he is claiming, alternatively, that choosing suicide commits me to the claim that pain does have some bearing on the value of my life, then the claim is more plausible. But then it is not clear why ending my life because I am suffering from great pain is wrong.

Because the book ranges so broadly, it is impossible to comment on all aspects of Altman's argument here. I will focus briefly on three topics, one from each part of the book. The first is our duty towards animals. Many contemporary Kantians depart from the strict letter of Kant's theory when it comes to the question of our duties to animals. Altman argues, however, that Kant's own theory can adequately account for our duties to animals. Kant's theory is anthropocentric, i.e., he holds that we have direct moral duties only to rational agents. According to Altman, this is not merely an unjustified bias on Kant's part. Kant's anthropocentrism is grounded in his theory of value and his view that only rational agents have moral worth (p. 33). How then to account for moral requirements not to be cruel to animals? These, according to Altman, are to be understood as indirect duties. Our duties not to mistreat animals are indirect moral requirements that are grounded in our duties to ourselves (in particular our duty to develop a virtuous character) and to other rational agents. Altman claims that cruelty to animals "coarsens our sensitivity to others' suffering (p. 17)." This not only corrupts our character, it makes us more likely to mistreat humans (p. 17). Thus we owe it to ourselves and to other human beings not to be cruel to animals. Altman cites empirical evidence for the link between cruelty to animals and mistreatment of human beings (p. 38, n. 10) and argues that Kant's anthropocentric account can adequately explain our duty not to support factory farming and to oppose unnecessary animal experimentation.

But what of those who remain ignorant of animal suffering? If I buy factory-farmed meat, but am ignorant of the animal suffering caused by factory farming, then the fact that my actions support this suffering does not seem to affect my character or treatment of others (see pp. 20-21). Here Altman suggests that "cultivating a lack of concern with animals whose suffering is not immediately apparent to us may encourage . . . blindness with regard to the suffering of humans whose plights are not brought to our attention (p. 21)." As Altman seems to recognize, this connection seems a bit tenuous.

Altman is aware of the apparent problem with the anthropocentric argument. It fails to capture strong intuitions about the reasons why cruelty to animals is wrong and why animal well-being matters. Even if we assume that there is a causal link between cruel treatment of animals and our attitudes towards, or treatment of, human beings, this seems to miss the point about why animal cruelty is bad. It would be like saying that I ought not to mistreat my children because doing so makes me more likely to be cruel to my employees. There is no doubt that this is reason, but it is not the central or most important one. Something similar is plausible when it comes to animal well-being. The central reason to oppose factory farming is that an animal's suffering is bad for it. Altman claims that Kant's theory of value gives us reason to deny this view, but his discussion of this point seems unlikely to be convincing to those not already persuaded by Kantian moral theory. Moreover, it seems that Altman is committed to the view that we can explain what we ought and ought not to do only by appeal to obligations that we owe to some agent. Even if we cannot owe a duty to an animal, many will find it natural to think that we can explain the moral limits on how we may treat animals just by appeal to features of the animal's own experience. Altman is committed to denying this, but I am not convinced that he has made a strong case for this denial.

The second topic is same-sex marriage. Altman defends a Kantian argument for same-sex marriage in Chapter 6. He begins from Kant's claim that sex is morally problematic in that the desire for sex is intrinsically a desire to use someone as a mere means. He argues, with Kant, that legal marriage is the only appropriate moral solution to this problem of instrumentalization/objectification. This is (at least in part) because in marriage one becomes legally bound to promote the interests of one's spouse (p. 148). He then goes on to suggest that the logic of Kant's argument requires the extension of marriage rights to same-sex couples. One problem with this strategy is that Kant's view on sex is not very plausible. It is plausible to think that sex is morally problematic when it displays attitudes of cruelty or disregard for others, but it is hard to be convinced that extramarital sex treats another as a mere means no matter how caring, open and considerate the partners may be. Moreover, it seems a strange strategy to found an argument for same-sex marriage on a theory of sexuality that condemns polyamory, not to mention other practices of sexuality that are defended by many in the gay community. Altman is aware of this objection (see p. 159), but he seems to want to hold onto the idea that only marriage can provide the context for morally acceptable sexual activity (p. 161). That idea certainly needs more defense than Altman provides here, however.

Although the first two parts of the book defend Kantian answers to moral questions, they also reveal a certain ambivalence about Kantian moral theory. In the final part of the book, Altman turns to criticism of Kant's a priori approach to moral philosophy. I'll mention only one of those arguments here. In Chapter 9, Altman argues that Kantian ethics cannot provide an account of collective or corporate responsibility of the sort that would be required in order to hold businesses (as opposed to individual actors) morally accountable for their actions. Altman makes a convincing Kantian case for the claim that businesses and other corporations are not moral agents and thus not the subjects of moral praise or blame. He suggests that this is a problem for Kant because in many cases harmful effects of corporate activity cannot be attributed to any particular actor. As he puts it, "responsibility tends to be diffused in a corporate setting (p. 234)." If we nevertheless want to hold a corporation morally responsible for producing these bad outcomes, we need a different account of the conditions of moral responsibility than Kant offers us. Altman gestures towards a Hegelian account of corporate moral responsibility (p. 230), but the Hegelian account is mysterious and is not developed at any length. In reading the chapter, I found myself reaching a somewhat different conclusion than Altman wants. The Kantian theory of agency that Altman discusses is a powerful conception of the conditions of moral responsibility. As such, it seems to raise a serious problem for the idea of corporate responsibility.

Kant and Applied Ethics is a stimulating attempt to assess the relevance of Kantian theory for contemporary moral problems. Kantian moral philosophers will find much to disagree with, but there is no doubt that the book raises important puzzles for Kantian moral theory. Those unpersuaded by Kantian theory may find ammunition to use against Kantianism. Those who wish to defend Kant's theory may find a helpful formulation of some serious challenges to Kant's moral philosophy.[1]

[1] I am grateful to Ginger Hoffman and Doug MacKay for comments on a draft of this review.