Kant and Colonialism: Historical and Critical Perspectives

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Katrin Flikschuh and Lea Ypi (eds.), Kant and Colonialism: Historical and Critical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2014, 254pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199669627.

Reviewed by Thomas Khurana, Goethe-Universität Frankfurt am Main


Although colonialism is only a marginal topic in Kant's writings, his remarks on the legitimacy or illegitimacy of colonial practices have naturally attracted much attention. As Kant is a main representative of enlightenment thinking and a herald of emancipatory theory, any putative endorsement or critique of colonialism on his part would seem to have far reaching implications: Kant's stance, whatever it turns out to be, could be understood as representative of the ways in which Western Enlightenment might be complicit with or, on the contrary, offer a resource for overcoming colonial oppression. This volume does not address the broader question of the general relation of enlightenment and colonialism directly but rather turns to the more limited task of getting clear about Kant's actual position regarding colonialism. It focuses on four issues.

(1) The first issue concerns Kant's shifting position on colonialism. Most readers will probably take Kant's critical remarks on colonial practices from The Metaphysics of Morals and Toward Perpetual Peace as his considered views. As the introduction and the contributions by Pauline Kleingeld and Lea Ypi make clear, however, Kant had not always held such critical views. Earlier in his critical period his remarks on colonial practices and slavery were at best neutral and often suggested that he regarded these practices as tolerable, maybe even necessary moments of the process of cultural and historical progress. In Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Aim (1784) Kant states, without any critical distancing, that "our" part of the world would probably eventually give laws to all other parts of the world.[1] In a number of other passages he refers to practices of colonial rule and slavery without offering any explicit criticism.[2]

It obviously seems puzzling that Kant, the great proponent of autonomy, should find colonial subjugation and slavery even tolerable. Kleingeld and Ypi both make the case that in order to account for this we have to take into consideration Kant's hierarchical account of the human races. In a number of essays on race and in various Lectures on Anthropology, Kant suggests that the human races differ with regard to their natural incentives and talents. They thus have different capacities to acquire culture and varying tendencies to perfect themselves. Consider, for example, the Anthropology lecture notes from 1781-82: Kant here holds that only the white race "contains all incentives and talents in itself"; the American indigenous people, by contrast, are said to be indifferent and lazy and to acquire no culture; the "Negro race . . . acquire[s] culture, but only a culture of slaves; that is, they allow themselves to be trained"; the "Hindus" finally "acquire culture in the highest degree, but only in the arts and not in the sciences. They never raise it up to abstract concepts" (AA 25:1187). Against the background of such a racial hierarchy, Kant seems to attribute to the white race a privileged role in actualizing humanity's full potential. Non-white races, conversely, seem predisposed, on his account, to assume subservient and dependent roles. It appears that it was this hierarchical account of the different human races that led to Kant's uncritical attitude towards colonial rule and slavery.

Yet his attitude contrasts starkly with the way in which, in his last works, Kant describes colonial rule as an unambiguous violation of right and accuses states in the Western European world of the horrifying "injustice they show in visiting foreign lands and peoples (which with them is tantamount to conquering them)."[3] With these practices, the "European savages" (AA 8:354), as Kant calls them, do not advance the progress of civilization, as they pretend to do, but rather display a barbarism that goes beyond the alleged "savagery" of the "foreign peoples". Kleingeld and Ypi both argue that Kant's changed position is connected to a changed understanding of the relevance of racial differences. As Kleingeld points out, Kant omits any characterization of the races from his 1798 Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View as he comes to realize that race cannot have any pragmatic relevance. Racial differences are the object of physiological knowledge of the human being, which is concerned with "what nature makes of the human being;" such knowledge has no direct bearing on our pragmatic knowledge of the human being, which is concerned with what man "as a free-acting being makes of himself, or can and should make of himself" (AA 7:119). Ypi suggests that Kant's shifting views in this regard might be connected to his changed understanding of biological predispositions: Kant's shift from a preformationst to an epigenetic account of living organization transforms his understanding of the role of natural predispositions in the actualization of a living being's potential. Against this background, he drops the reference to preformed germs that separate human races and that lay at the basis of the respective racial hierarchy in his earlier writings.

(2) The second main theme concerns the way in which the critical perspective on colonial practices that Kant arrived at in his last writings is rooted in his philosophy of right. As Arthur Ripstein points out, Kant distinguishes three distinct wrongs of colonialism: (i) the wrongfulness of colonial conquest, (ii) the wrongfulness of the status of a colony and (iii) the wrongfulness of the ways in which colonial rule is typically carried out. The first wrong (i) is based on the fact that colonial conquest amounts to a "way of acquiring territory through the use of force" (148) and is hence continuous with forms of aggressive war, which Kant considers illegitimate. Colonial wars are especially problematic, as they are inconsistent with the continued existence of both belligerents, a requirement to be respected by any rightful type of warfare. (ii) Even in cases where colonial rule might come about as a consequence of a defensive and hence legitimate war, colonial rule is still objectionable as a post bellum mode of governance. Colonial rule entails that one nation continually rules over another and is thus at odds with the right of the inhabitants of the colony to govern themselves through their own institutions. In this regard, even annexation would seem to be a better solution as this at least allows the inhabitants of the colony to enjoy full membership in the newly extended state, a status whereby they are able to rule themselves. The inhabitants of the colony by contrast remain merely passive citizens. (iii) Finally, the third wrong in colonialism concerns the specific way in which colonial rule is exerted. Granted that colonial rule as such is wrong, it still allows for an internal normative standard: if we hold colonial rule to what it itself claims to be doing, we should require that proper colonial rule should operate on behalf of the inhabitants of the colony and should not work to realize the private purposes of the colonizers. According to Kant's characterization, European colonial practices are guilty of all three wrongs of colonialism.

Given these wrongs, it might seem natural to expect Kant to articulate a specific right to resist colonial rule and an immediate obligation to compensate colonies for the wrongs they have endured. As Ripstein, Anthony Pagden and Peter Niesen make clear, however, Kant's position on these issues is more complicated. On Kant's account, illicit means of acquisition can still give rise to good title. Even though a state might have extended its territory by means of an aggressive war and therefore through illegitimate means, we must respect the integrity of the new territory once peace has been established. The obvious danger in this regard is that Kant thereby opens the possibility of an ex post facto justification of war and colonial rule (Ripstein: 153) and seems to block the right to "any kind of struggle for independence" (Pagden: 41). Regarding the possibility of restorative justice, Kant is "on record as opposing the rectification of historical wrongs" (Niesen: 183) as he demands that historical grievances be laid to rest in order to allow for a true peace. As Niesen tries to argue, there is, however, still room to formulate principles of restorative justice regarding colonial practices on the level of international and cosmopolitan law that Kant could endorse (see also Pagden: 40).

These complications all point to a feature of Kant's philosophy of right that puts restrictions on his critique of colonialism: Kant's entire philosophy of right rests on our fundamental duty to enter into a civil state and sustain it, once such a civil state has been established, no matter how it came about and how imperfect its current state might be.[4] It is against this background that Kant seems hesitant to accord a colonized people the right to resist the colonial rule once it has been established. And it would not be wholly surprising if Kant would therefore also regard it as legitimate for European people to force members of non-state people into a civil union with them. If the formation of a just civil constitution is indeed the highest task nature has set for humankind[5], could it not be legitimate to use the force of colonial practices to bring this end about? As Anna Stilz points out, it is quite remarkable that, in his last writings, Kant strongly resists such an idea and explicitly denies European colonizers the right to force non-state people into a civil union with them (see AA 6:266). However, it is up for debate why exactly Kant thinks this is. Stilz considers two options. Either Kant thinks that the non-state people have already entered a civil state of their own that ought to be respected; or he thinks that the European's encounter with them is not inevitable and that their duty to enter into a civil state is a duty they have only amongst themselves, not with the colonizers. After all, the duty to enter a civil state only holds where "you cannot help associating with others" (AA 6:237) and "cannot avoid living side by side with all others" (AA 6:307).

(3) The third issue is the distinction between the criticized forms of colonial practices on the one hand and legitimate forms of international commerce and settlement on the other. As a number of contributors suggest (e.g. Muthu and Ypi), the fact that colonial practices occur in the world is not a mere accident on Kant's account, but intimately related to a certain elementary disposition of human beings: their "unsocial sociability" that leads to expansive commerce and communication, to competition and conflict. As Sankar Muthu especially argues, this predisposition to unsocial sociability has to be understood in such a way that it can both give rise to the criticized practices of European colonialism and lead to forms of fair international trade and legitimate settlement.

In order to separate the two cases, Muthu distinguishes two types of "resistance" rooted in our unsocial sociability: a justifiable and productive form -- resistance for equal worth -- and an unjustifiable and domineering one -- resistance for greater worth. Where the latter lies at the foundation of colonial practices of domination and subjugation, the "resistance for equal worth" provides a source for forms of commerce and interaction that require and involve equality. This productive form of resistance can also manifest itself in the rejection of communication and interaction. Where confronted with potential colonizers, we are entitled to exclude them from community with us. In this regard, Kant has explicitly granted peoples the right to deny foreigners full entry into their communities. In Toward Perpetual Peace Kant refers to China and Japan in this regard and praises them for the restrictions under which they have put their visitors (AA 8:359).

Cosmopolitan right therefore does not entitle us to force others into a permanent community with us but only obliges others to give us the opportunity and space to make communicative offers to them. As Liesbet Vanhaute argues, the legitimate forms of trade and settlement that might spring from such communicative offers and visits are, according to Kant, dependent on contracts. This holds true for both the legitimate forms of settlement (AA 6:353) as well as for commercial transactions. Where the criticized colonial practices are marked by violence and exploitation on the part of the colonizers and a disregard of the right of the visited people to reject the offers, legitimate forms of international commerce and interaction depend on the agreement of the visited people as manifested in contractual relations. Contracts are declarations of two wills united in agreement and imply a formal equality of the contracting parties.

This way of distinguishing legitimate forms of commerce and settlement, however, might give rise to another worry: Given that Kant thinks that the binding force of contracts depends "on a third party that has the power to coerce" (Vanhaute: 138; cf. AA 6:284), it might seem that because members of different nations lack an institution that is equally binding for both parties, contracts between such parties are precarious and prone to be exploited or broken by the stronger party. In order to avoid this, it seems necessary that the two contracting partners become part of an encompassing civil unity and thus subject to a power that rules both. But does this not mean that even the legitimate forms of settlement and commerce give rise to a colonial dynamic whereby the visitors drive non-state people into civil union with them? Thus, we might worry whether contracts that are supposed to avoid the unilateral violence of colonial practices might have a colonizing effect of a different sort (involving the imposition of forms of legal and political regulation by the stronger party on peoples that may have up until now institutionalized freedom and justice quite differently).

(4) The volume closes with Martin Ajei and Katrin Flikschuh raising the important question whether a Kantian position more generally contains resources for a critical stance towards the present post- or neo-colonial condition. They warn us against trying to exonerate ourselves by pointing fingers at historical authors such as Kant for remarks that might seem apologetic of colonialism. Instead, they argue, we should develop the critical resources of Kant's philosophy in order to criticize the continued impact of colonial practices on our contemporary discourses and forms of life. They think that the formalism of the Kantian position makes him an especially powerful resource for the critical analysis of the "colonial mentality" still present in global justice discourses of today.

As should be clear by now, this volume is highly instructive and the right starting point for anyone who wants to understand Kant's position on colonialism. It is only natural that such an instructive volume should point to further questions it cannot deal with directly. In two regards, however, additional material could have significantly improved the volume. First, it seems unfortunate that the editors have not included any contributions along the lines of a stronger criticism of Kant's position, discussing the possibility of a deeper and lasting allegiance of his philosophy with colonialism. Although the contributions are very nuanced and balanced, the way the editors introduce the volume and dismiss such stronger criticism with a sleight of hand and without giving any representative the chance to make her case gives rise to the worry that it has a fundamentally apologetic agenda and is designed to defend Kant against these attacks. This seems, as I said, unfortunate, since the volume's intention seems not to be protecting Kant or Kantianism from criticism but rather to evaluate and develop resources for a critical stance towards colonial and post-colonial forms of domination and exploitation.

Secondly, it might have been helpful to include contributions that do not circle around the few passages in which Kant explicitly comments on colonialism, as most contributions do, but widen the perspective. Apart from the question whether Kant was apologetic or critical of colonialism, we might ask whether Kant's philosophy has the resources necessary to fully grasp the problem and dynamic of colonialism in the first place. If we assume that colonialism is in some deeper sense connected to global commerce and capitalism, as some post-Kantian authors have argued, does Kant indeed provide the resources to understand and criticize the full scope of colonialist practices? And could it not also be the case that while critical of the colonial practices of his time, Kant retained underlying commitments that tie him to the age of colonialism, even if unwillingly? Two such commitments that are touched upon in this volume and that deserve further investigation are Kant's understanding of the process of civilization and the fundamental link he draws between property and right. Regarding the process of civilization, Kant seems to embrace at various points that the desire to own and to master are irreducible vehicles for the unfolding of humanity's potential. Against this background, competitive commerce and even war seem to be necessary elements in nature's hidden plan for us. Would such a view not give rise to the idea that certain colonial practices are somehow justified by the contribution they make to the civilizing process? And does Kant's conception of this civilizing progress not imply that, even if certain colonial means are problematic, it is in general a good thing to involve "savages" in this civilizing process?[6] The fact that Kant distinguishes mere civilization from moralization and criticizes our age for being excessively civilized but not moral yet[7] gives him the resources for a critical stance towards the idea of civilization. Yet, it might still be true that Kant for the most part presents civilization as a necessary condition of moralization, so that the civilization and its vices might appear as if necessary and ultimately justified.

The second fundamental commitment that might imply a deeper affinity between Kant's position and the age of colonialism is the fact that right, according to Kant, emerges out of a unilateral act of occupation. We enter the normative sphere of right first by claiming a provisional right with regard to the things we appropriate and thereby withdraw from the use of others, and secondly by entering into a civil union with others in order to secure those provisional rights. Does this account of right not tie the very idea of right to an original scene of colonial violence: of claiming as mine what belongs to all of us and of forcing the other under a rule of law to secure my property? I don't want to suggest that Kant could not be defended against such a reading, but it would seem fruitful to me to at least consider such worries.

These are of course more speculative questions than the ones this volume wants to answer. However, it seems to me that to pursue questions of this sort would help us see the issues the volume does deal with in their broader context. The question of what Kant specifically held at this or that point in his intellectual career with regard to colonialism gains its relevance precisely insofar as it can tell us something about the intricate relation of enlightenment rationalism and colonialism. To realize that the resources of a Kantian position might be limited, be it with regard to delegitimating the colonial practices of his own time or the cultural and economic imperialism of capitalism today, is not to disqualify his philosophy in order to exonerate ourselves. Quite the contrary, it is to raise the question whether our continued adherence to a certain idea of civilization and a certain conception of right as grounded in property might still implicate us in a broader form of post-colonial regime.

[1] See AA 8:29. I cite Kant according to volume and page number of the Akademie-Ausgabe of Kant's Gesammelte Schriften; translations are taken from the Cambridge Edition of Kant's works.

[2] See AA 2:438, 8:174 and various student lecture notes on Anthropology (e.g. AA 25:362-5) and physical Geography (Dohna 236, 238, 241; Doenhoff 189).

[3] Toward Perpetual Peace, AA 8:358; cf. also AA 8:344, 8:354ff.; AA 6:265f., 6:348f., 6:353f.

[4] For the duty to enter a civil state see AA 6:307, 6:237, 6:255; regarding the duty to remain an obedient subject to a civil order, no matter how unbearable its present state and how dubious its beginnings see AA 6:320ff.

[5] See AA 8:22ff., AA 8:365ff.

[6] Cf. Kant's remark, cited by Pagden on p. 37, that "the world would lose nothing if Tahiti were simply swallowed up" (AA 15:785).

[7] See AA 8:26, AA 9:451; cf. also AA 7:321ff., AA5:431ff.