Kant and Cosmopolitanism

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Pauline Kleingeld, Kant and Cosmopolitanism: The Philosophical Ideal of World Citizenship, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 215pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521764186.

Reviewed by Susan Shell, Boston College


Pauline Kleingeld's new volume is a very welcome addition to a growing list of studies of Kant's practical thought and its implications for contemporary politics. Among its many strengths is an exemplary attention both to specific Kantian texts and to historical material that "contextualizes" Kant's arguments without weakening their philosophic force or ongoing relevance. The specific focus of the book is Kant's shifting attitude toward "cosmopolitanism," with particular emphasis on his settled or final views -- views that on her account fully emerge only in the 1790's. As Kleingeld is at pains to show, Kant's ultimate positions on a variety of issues are often far more subtle and reasonable than current opinion generally has it. On timely subjects ranging from the respective claims of patriotism and cosmopolitanism, racism and cultural diversity, international trade, humanitarian right, prospects for global peace, and world statehood, the author establishes Kant as a clear-thinking "liberal" in the best sense: neither hopelessly naïve nor so inured to human wickedness as to dismiss all prospects for political progress as ill-founded.

The method that Kleingeld employs is an unusual and unusually felicitous one, both for its historical insights and for its accessibility and clarity of presentation. Each chapter of the volume is a self-contained study of a single issue, in which Kleingeld juxtaposes Kant's evolving position with that of a less famous contemporary author, whose opinions approach those typically (but wrongly) associated with Kant himself. The result is not only an unusually fresh and instructive introduction to Kant's political and intellectual milieu; it also serves to throw into sharp relief features of Kant's teaching that will surprise, and occasionally provoke, modern readers. The Kant that emerges is one that will be particularly reassuring to those of a moderate "Europeanist" or "internationalist" bent -- an attractively reasonable thinker, who gives way to none of the extremes with which he is often taxed, be it a universalizing indifference of the claims of the particular, or a rigoristic insistence on legal norms that precludes prudent on-the-ground decision-making. If there is a defect in the this approach it lies, perhaps, in a tendency to leave unaddressed certain unresolved tensions in Kant's thinking, tensions of which Kant himself may have been more aware than Kleingeld allows.

The first substantive chapter, on "moral cosmopolitanism and patriotism," contrasts Kant with Christoph Martin Wieland, an influential German author best known for a satirical work entitled The Abderites, which championed a certain conception of "world-citizenship" against which German romanticism would later partly define itself. (Kleingeld does not discuss Kant's own extended appropriation of Wieland's title in the Conflict of the Faculties, where it is associated with the claim that all collective human efforts at improvement are in vain.) As Kleingeld observes, Kant's own version of "world citizenship" differed most decisively from that of Wieland by embracing, under Rousseau's influence, the moral equality of all human beings. Where Wieland limits genuine world citizenship to "sages" as opposed to ordinary humans, Kant makes admission of the moral equality of all human beings the crucial pre-condition of world citizenship as such.

Still, both Wieland and Kant insist on the compatibility of cosmopolitanism and special duties toward the inhabitants of one's own country, duties which consist, first and foremost, as Kleingeld effectively argues, in the promotion of a "just political system." In Wieland's case, patriotism lies in "love of the present constitution of one's commonwealth" arising from the contentment brought about by just laws and their reliable enforcement, with no preference whatsoever for republican forms as such. For Kant, however, just laws are necessarily republican; and love of country is accordingly properly directed first and foremost toward the establishment of republican forms, and, as Kleingeld brings out, the resources for a Kantian patriotism are far richer than commonly believed. At the same time, whereas for Wieland a certain cosmopolitan preference for one's own people is allowed as a matter of efficiency (it being easier to be of help to those with whom one is familiar), the Kantian basis for such preference is somewhat harder to make out.

Though a Kantian might well wish to work for justice at home and abroad simultaneously without compromising on either front, that this is always possible remains unclear, given a variety of "hard cases" that readily come to mind, from fighting wars of national survival to otherwise competing in a world in which resources are scarce. Nor does the author's final claim that "there is no more reason to believe that world citizenship poses a danger to one's state than that state citizenship poses a danger to one's family"(35) fully get round the difficulty. For as Kant himself admits, civic duty may well sometimes prove destructive of domestic relationships -- e.g., when family members find themselves compelled to turn in guilty relatives. In sum: as Kant himself admits, in Toward Perpetual Peace, outside the boundaries of what he calls a "federative union," the marriage of "morality" and "politics" remains uncertain [see 8:385].

Chapter Two, on global peace, profitably compares Kant to Anacharsis Cloos, a prolific Jacobin, originally from the Netherlands. Cloos advocated a more extreme version of cosmopolitan republicanism, in the form of a world state, than his Jacobin colleagues (who ultimately sent him to the guillotine) were finally willing to tolerate. It is very useful to be reminded of how moderate Kant's own proposals really were in comparison with the radical ideals in circulation in late eighteenth century Europe. The key to Kant's own approach to world-republicanism lies in the necessarily voluntary character of each nation state's submission to such union, a submission predicated on a very high level of internal civic culture. Less clear, to this reader at least, is whether the tension between a voluntary union among a plurality of sovereign states and a coercive world government can be resolved as neatly as the author indicates, given Kant's admission that the ideal in question "will never be reached completely" [52]. This difficulty seems to foreshadow current European difficulties as summarized in the constitutional formula of "ever closer union." Still, Kleingeld makes an original and compelling case for the underlying coherence of Kant's late position in a manner that also does creditable justice to earlier stages of his thought.

Chapter Three, on cosmopolitan right, should be of particular interest to current students and practitioners of international law. Kant was far ahead of his time on issues of humanitarian right, as the author's treatment of such issues as refugee policy and justified restrictions on free trade ably shows. Kant's treatment of race (the topic of Chapter Four) is far less attractive -- hence the propensity of most contemporary Kant scholars, who tend either to ignore the topic or to treat it as a cudgel with which to beat him. Kleingeld does neither, instead arguing that his decidedly inegalitarian views eventually gave way to something approaching racial equality, for all political and ethical purposes. Building her case around such facts as the virtual disappearance of the topic of race from Kant's late, published Anthropology, she also insightfully discusses Kant's relation to famous contemporaries such as Georg Forster and Herder, as well as to lesser known figures like Johann Daniel Metzger and Samuel Thomas Soemmerling. Though the author's claim with respect to Kant's late thought (having been earlier advanced by Peter Fenves, among others) may be less original than she suggests, it is presented with unusual clarity and perspicacity.

Among the richest and most instructive of the author's discussions is Chapter Five, devoted to issues of domestic and international commerce. Dietrich Hermann Hegewisch, a contemporary of Kant who taught at the university of Kiel, was an early German champion of the economic thought of Adam Smith; and the extremity of his views serves as a useful foil for Kant's more nuanced and politically and ethically astute approach to economic rights. Although Kant has sometimes been mistaken for an economic libertarian (or, alternatively, for endorsing no particular position at all vis-à-vis economic equality), his actual position treats private and public prosperity, or what Smith calls "the wealth of nations," as a means rather than an end. Some readers may find some of her conclusions (e.g., favoring redistribution on the grounds that current inequalities reflect prior governmental injustices) overdrawn or otherwise unpersuasive; still her overall approach is unusually astute both in its command of a wide variety of Kant's works and its attentiveness to the larger political and moral context.

Chapters Six and Seven (on Kant and Novalis on the development of cosmopolitan community and on the implications of Kant's theory for current philosophical debates, respectively) will also reward the reader with new insights on topics of current salience, including the role of intermediary institutions and cultural beliefs in facilitating political and moral progress. Kleingeld is especially good at showing that Kant's approach to history is anything but naively "optimistic." And she makes a convincing case for the "evolving" nature of his cosmopolitan commitments. It is less clear however, from her presentation, whether, and in what sense, "world government with coercive powers" remains an attainable goal for Kant. Would it require the unanimous consent of all parties concerned -- i.e., a radical transformation of the "Denkungsart" of all people everywhere? Or would it suffice for elected representatives of all nations to agree? Or is there some other way in which to reconcile the dissolution of rightly constituted sovereign states with the right of all people to be bound only by laws to which they have consented? These and similar questions, on which the actualizability of coercive world government depends, are not here explored.

In sum, the various chapters of this volume not only substantially advance our comprehension of specific features of Kant's "cosmopolitanism"; they also collectively show what can be gained from a skillful and judicious combination of philosophic and historical inquiry. The Kant who emerges from these essays is one whose views changed over time in ways that reflect his own enhanced theoretical and practical understanding and from which contemporary discourse could well profit. If Kleingeld's approach is to be faulted it is, perhaps, for paying insufficient attention to various tensions that arise in Kant's thought between the claims of the ideal and the realities inhibiting its full realization, both on the domestic and the cosmopolitan plane. Still, readers will find much in Kleingeld's rich and illuminating discussions of the many topics canvassed for which to be thankful.