Kant and Education: Interpretations and Commentary

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Klas Roth and Chris W. Surprenant (eds.), Kant and Education: Interpretations and Commentary, Routledge, 2012, 233pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415889803.

Reviewed by Owen Ware, Temple University


Kant was often ambivalent about the power of philosophy to affect the world.[1] One exception was his view of educational theory. Philosophy, he believed, is responsible for guarding this science: the science that should serve educators "as a guide to prepare well and clearly the path to wisdom which everyone should travel, and to secure others against taking the wrong way" (KpV 5:163). Philosophy is at the "narrow gate" that leads, through practitioners of education, to the public at large. Only a few, however, need bother with the "subtle investigations" of its theory.

Kant and Education brings together sixteen essays by an international group of scholars. The range of topics covered in the anthology is impressive. Kant's contribution to contemporary theories of education is central, as well as Kant's intellectual debt to Rousseau, the role of education in Kant's normative theories, and the impact of Kant's ideas on subsequent generations. Add to this the relative shortness of each essay (ten to fifteen pages), and one is left with an accessible introduction to a fascinating, but often neglected, topic of Kant's ethical theory. The editors, Klas Roth and Chris W. Surprenant, have done an admirable job.

Below I will discuss three of the volume's unifying themes. Due to restrictions of space I will not be able to discuss each essay individually.

I. Paradoxes of Education and Autonomy

Many authors in the volume examine the paradoxes that surround both Kant's writings on education and contemporary theories of pedagogy. Jørgan Huggler explores the idea of education as a bridge from nature to culture in Kant's philosophy. Lars Løvlie offers a series of reflections on the relevance of Kant's writings on education for our contemporary practices and policies. Paul Formosa and James Scott Johnston compare Kant's ideas to theories of moral development by Lawrence Kohlberg and John Rawls. Lastly, Roth turns to Kant to bring into focus a number of tensions which lie in the education policy texts of the European Union.

One question that surfaces in these discussions is the so-called "moral paradox." The paradox relates to the question of how autonomy can be taught. In Kant's ethics this has special urgency. We can ask how any educational process can, through extrinsic motivational forces, bring an agent to exercise his or her moral judgment in a genuinely autonomous way.

In "Kant's Contribution to Moral Education," Surprenant argues that Kant's method of "moral catechism," outlined in the Metaphysics of Morals (1797), works toward answering this. Moral catechism involves having the student repeat a series of questions and answers in a way that enables her to exercise and cultivate moral judgment (MS 6:479). For Kant, the question-answer interplay is designed to promote two things: (i) the pupil's reflection on her happiness as the greatest desire she has, and (ii) the condition of her worthiness to be happy, which Kant argues resides in acting out of respect for the moral law.

Surprenant argues that the catechistic education is unable to cause a transition to (ii): it cannot explain how the child is to have an appropriate motivational response to the moral law. Kant acknowledges this too, and in the second Critique (1788) he argues that examples of people who have upheld their moral commitments on pain of suffering (or death) serve this role. Moral examples represent in an especially vivid manner our capacity for freedom, a capacity which makes overcoming our strongest inclinations a real possibility for us. Surprenant again points out that Kant is not clear how the stages of this process are linked (p. 9). How does the catechistic method relate to moral examples? And how do moral examples elicit within the child a sense of her own freedom?

I think the answer is contained in Chapter III of the second Critique, titled "On the Incentives of Pure Practical Reason." Kant argues that our consciousness of the moral law must have an influence on sensibility. We must feel something like "pain" when we recognize the limited value and authority of our inclinations (KpV 5:73). Yet we must also feel something like "pleasure," for in limiting our self-love we are in a position to recognize our rational nature, i.e., our capacity to act autonomously. From this point of view Kant's remarks on moral examples make sense. For he says that when the pupil reflects on examples of pure resolution,

the pupil's attention is fixed on the consciousness of his freedom and, although this renunciation excites an initial feeling of pain, nevertheless, by its withdrawing the pupil from the constraint of even true needs, there is made known to him . . . the inner freedom to release himself from the impetuous importunity of inclinations (KpV 160-161).

II. Moral Education in Kant's Normative Ethics

For the most part the place of moral education in Kant's normative ethics is unclear. A number of the essays address this topic. Gary B. Herbert discusses some parallels between Kant's theoretical and practical philosophy, arguing that moral education "schematizes" the principles of virtue by providing children with the conditions in which these principles can be meaningfully imposed onto them. Richard Dean takes up the question of why Kant never specified a duty to moral education. And Alix Cohen addresses what she calls the "anthropological dimension" of moral education, focusing on the apparent tension between the child's educability and her freedom of will.

In "Examples of Moral Possibility," Paul Guyer explains the many uses of examples in Kant's ethical theory, focusing on their role for bringing about the child's recognition of her capacity to act out of respect for the moral law. After explaining that the examples Kant uses in Section II of the Groundwork (1785) are thought experiments, not cases of empirically observed behavior, Guyer turns to Kant's claim that representations of virtuous behavior have a distinctive value for allowing people, especially children, to recognize their own freedom. This idea first appears in the second Critique in the illustration of a prince who would like to have an individual bring false charges against an innocent man, a request the individual can deny only on pain of execution (KpV 5:30). Kant takes this to exhibit the "fact" that in our ordinary moral consciousness we recognize the authority of a formal principle over our own material interests, a recognition he thinks must elicit from us the judgment that, were we in the place of this poor individual, we ought to deny the prince.

Guyer next observes that we find a historical version of the thought experiment in Part II of the second Critique, titled "On the Doctrine of the Method of Pure Practical Reason." The example is of an individual who refuses to give in to Henry VIII's conspirators against Anne Boleyn -- an example Kant may have modeled after Henry Norris who, in David Hume's words, "would rather die a thousand deaths than calumniate an innocent person" (cited by Guyer, p. 136). Guyer explains that the example works precisely to invoke in the child a sense of awe, first, in the individual's strength and purity of will, and second, in the child's recognition that the capacity for such strength resides within her. From this we can see how Kant's theory of moral education connects with his treatments of moral authority, moral feeling, and autonomy of will. As Guyer puts it, the second Critique, "which begins with the fact of reason, ends with the story of Anne Boleyn and one man who refused to join in betraying her" (p. 137).

III. Kant's Philosophy of Education: Context and Influences

Stepping back, many of the essays take up issues relating to the development of Kant's educational theories and their influence on later generations. Joseph R. Reisert and Phillip Scuderi compare Rousseau's account on the education of children in Emile to Kant's Lectures on Pedagogy. Robert B. Louden discusses Kant's work in the 1770s to promote Basedow's experimental school for children, the Philanthopin in Dessau Germany. Richard Velkley and Susan Meld Shell offer reflections on Kant's influence, both on post-Kantian philosophy and on the emergence of the humanities as a university discipline.

In "Kant on Education, Anthropology, and Ethics," Manfred Kuehn explores the link between Kant's views on education and character formation. Kuehn shows that the early anthropology lectures from 1772-1773 and 1774-1775 discuss the formation of character in naturalistic terms. Character is a complex product of education where an individual's natural dispositions play a decisive role. Education shapes what nature provides, and yet nature may provide a block. Someone without a capacity for resolutions, for instance, may be unable to possess character.

If we look at these remarks from the standpoint of the Anthropology (1797), we see a striking contrast. In the mature work Kant distinguishes "temperament" and "natural aptitude" from character: "The first two predispositions indicate what can be made of the human being; the last (moral) predisposition indicates what can he can make of himself" (Anth 7:285). Elsewhere in the Anthropology Kant speaks of the acquisition of character in terms of a revolution or "rebirth" (Anth 7:294), similar to the account of motivational conversion outlined in the Religion (1793) (RGV 6:47-48).

Kuehn argues that Kant's anti-naturalist turn sheds light on his changing attitude toward education (p. 59). If coming to acquire character requires an act of spontaneity, in which one freely gives rational principles to oneself, then educative practices can only have an indirect role in moral life. Kuehn suggests that the increasing importance of autonomy in Kant's ethics between 1772 and 1797 mirrors the decreasing importance of education -- although he argues that education plays a more positive role in Kant's social and political philosophy (pp. 63-64). On the first point I would argue that the indirect role Kant came to assign to education was not a demotion, but rather a necessary response to his mature view of freedom. At any rate I think Kuehn's broader point is correct, and it resonates well with Kant and Education as a whole: namely, that "educability is not just one of the essential characteristics of human beings, but the most important one of all" (p. 66).


In the Introduction Roth and Surprenant state that their aim is "to broaden and deepen discussion of the implications of Kant's moral and political philosophy and aesthetics for education, and also of the value and significance of his ideas on education" (p. iv). I believe they are largely successful, and that the clarity of the essays makes the book appropriate for a broader philosophical audience.

One criticism I have is that the volume lacks the degree of analytical interpretation and argument one would expect in a work aimed at Kant scholars. For this reason it will be of greater use for researchers new to the topic who are seeking an overview of the field, not those standing at philosophy's "narrow gate." More positively, however, I think the collection would be effective in serving to introduce Kant's ethical theory outside of the Groundwork, giving students a chance to encounter a more psychologically rich and historically sensitive side to Kant's thinking.

Overall, Kant and Education is a welcome contribution to what will likely be a fertile area of Kant scholarship in years to come.

[1] I will cite by volume and page number from the Berlin Academy edition, using standard abbreviations of Kant's texts.