Kant and His German Contemporaries, Volume 1: Logic, Mind, Epistemology, Science and Ethics

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Corey W. Dyck and Falk Wunderlich (eds.), Kant and His German Contemporaries, Volume 1: Logic, Mind, Epistemology, Science and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 294pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107140899.

Reviewed by J. Colin McQuillan, St. Mary's University


Volumes like this one edited by Corey W. Dyck and Falk Wunderlich are as important to the historiography of philosophy as they are for our knowledge of German philosophy in the eighteenth century. They show that the "grand narrative" approach to the history of philosophy, which only pauses to mention a few great works by a small number of major figures from a relatively small part of the world, is simply not satisfactory as a way of writing philosophy's history.[1]

That grand narrative histories are shaped by prejudice is demonstrated by works like Peter Park's Africa, Asia, and the History of Philosophy (2013), which recounts how German historians of philosophy during the late eighteenth and nineteenth centuries grounded their histories in racist anthropology and systematically excluded non-European philosophy from their histories.[2] The studies of early modern women philosophers, undertaken by Project Vox and New Narratives in the History of Philosophy, make a similar point, though they do more than diagnose the prejudices that have excluded women from the history of philosophy. Their efforts to "reconfigure, enrich, and reinvigorate the philosophical canon" serve as helpful models for correcting the historical-philosophical record.[3]

Works like Kant and His German Contemporaries may not directly confront the prejudices that guide the grand narrative histories, but they help us see that these narratives distort and misrepresent the history of philosophy in other ways too.[4] They show that even philosophers, like Kant, who are recognized as major figures and play central roles in the grand narratives, were engaged in discussions of "enormous intellectual richness, vigor and importance" (1) with figures and works, ideas and arguments, that are routinely ignored by grand narrative histories. That Kant's philosophical exchanges with his German contemporaries "did not fit neatly into the narrative advanced by Kantian historians in particular, which divided the pre-Kantian philosophical debate into warring rationalist and empiricist camps, the better to retrospectively prepare the way for Kant's own novel synthesis" (2), is all the more reason to question the veracity of these narratives.

The book is divided into five parts, which reconstruct Kant's philosophical relationships with his predecessors, peers, and successors by focusing on different themes. In the first part, on formal and transcendental logic, Brian A. Chance argues that the conception of "purity" that Wolff employs in his empirical psychology had an important influence on the structure of Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787). While Kant often uses "pure" as a synonym for "a priori," Chance suggests that he also uses "purity" to refer to "the ability of one cognitive faculty to create representation without relying on others" -- a sense of the term that derives from Wolff's Deutsche Metaphysik (1719), where the "pure understanding" is defined by its independence from the faculties of imagination and reason (20). This conception of purity helps Chance to show that there is a "perfect similarity" (29) between the pure and applied parts of general logic and the divisions of transcendental logic that Kant lays out in the 'Transcendental Analytic' and 'Transcendental Dialectic.' Huaping Lu-Adler considers the relationship between mathematics and logic from a Kantian perspective, treating Kant's use of circular notation to represent logical relations as a kind of case study. She shows that Kant adopted this form of notation from Euler, though his views on the nature of logic led him to change the context in which it was used. Instead of using circles to sensualize logical abstractions, Kant used them to separate concepts and their extensions from their empirical sources, so that they could be considered purely formally (52-53).

In the second part, on metaphysics and the philosophy of mind, Udo Thiel examines Tetens' conception of Selbstgefühl. Against Hume, Tetens holds that Selbstgefühl can ground the psychological unity of the self, though he acknowledges that the "ontological ground" of that unity remains an object of "theoretical speculation" (68). Kant rejects the claim that inner sense is sufficient for psychological unity, though he shares Tetens' views about the importance of unity for empirical psychological conceptions of the self as well as his claims about the necessity of psychological unity for our cognition of objects (72-75). Dyck turns to the rational psychology of Georg Friedrich Meier, who is remembered as the author of the Auszug aus der Vernunftlehre (1752) that Kant used as a textbook in his logic lectures, but who also wrote on the immortality of the soul in a way that "constitutes a clear anticipation of Kant's own distinctive claim that the immortality of the soul is (merely) an object of a moral belief" (77).[5] Central to Dyck's argument is Meier's critique of demonstrative proofs of the soul's immortality and his insistence that moral certainty of the soul's survival of death can be grounded in reason as well as in religious revelation (82). Brandon C. Look surveys Maimon's response to Kant's first Critique and his Leibnizian criticism of Kant's distinction between sensibility and the understanding. In the end, Look suggests that Maimon's criticism forced Kant to acknowledge that Leibniz had, in fact, distinguished sensibility and the understanding and even to claim that, in his pre-established harmony, Leibniz "had in mind not the harmony of two different natures, namely, sense and understanding, but that of two faculties belonging to the same nature, in which sensibility and understanding harmonize to form experiential knowledge" (109).

The third part, on truth, idealism, and skepticism, begins with a chapter comparing Lambert's and Kant's conception of truth by Thomas Sturm. Starting with a discussion of "Putnam's Kant," that is, Kant as an internal realist, Sturm argues that Kant's conception of truth is "conceptually independent of his account of knowledge -- and in part even guides and restricts the latter" (119), which makes it difficult to situate him within contemporary debates between realists and anti-realists. Sturm then considers the distinction between logical and metaphysical truth in Lambert (120-124) and Kant's impossibility argument, which suggests that truth cannot be defined without reference to the content of a judgment (124-129), showing that, while there is broad agreement between them, Kant limits the explanatory power of a definition of truth (130).

Also working in a comparative mode, Paul Guyer explores the similarities between Mendelssohn's refutation of idealism in the Morgenstunden (1785) and Kant's arguments in the first Critique.[6] Guyer argues, first, that Kant added his 'Refutation' to the second (1787, B) edition in part to respond to Mendelssohn and not only in response to the charge, made in the Feder-Garve review, that his idealism was indistinguishable from Berkeley's. Second, he notes that, unlike Mendelssohn, Kant denies the spatio-temporality of things in themselves (136, 148-150), thus embracing idealism, while also including "an a priori and anti-Cartesian proof that the possibility of self-knowledge is dependent upon belief in the independent existence of enduring objects," which "makes Kant's idealism a transcendental idealism" (136, 150-152).

Falk Wunderlich turns his attention to Platner's shifting criticisms of Kant in the second (1784) and third (1793) editions of his Philosophische Aphorismen. Wunderlich shows that, in the second edition, Platner accused Kant of being a Humean skeptic, who denied "that there is a self beyond the operations of the mind" (157), despite the evidence of our "feeling of self" (157-158). In the third edition, Platner positions himself as a skeptic, while condemning Kant for dogmatically attempting "to measure the bounds of the entire cognitive faculty, and, based on that, to determine the bounds of metaphysics with demonstrative exactness" (161).

In part four, on the history and philosophy of science, Eric Watkins focuses on "two specific issues that are central to Lambert's and Kant's projects, namely what cognition (Erkenntnis) is and how it relates to science (Wissenschaft)" (180). He identifies a series of similarities and differences between Lambert and Kant (185-190), which show that, while the two philosophers understand a priori cognition in remarkably similar ways, Kant draws a clearer account of the relations between intuitions, concepts, and cognition than Lambert does and also explains, through his conception of reason, the unity and end of science, as well as its relation to morality and its place in a philosophical system, more fully than does Lambert. Jennifer Mensch calls our attention to Kant's appeal to Blumenbach's "formative drive" (Bildungstrieb) in the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790). Mensch carefully reconstructs the context of Kant's reference to Blumenbach, namely, Kant's ongoing polemic against Herder; his developing views on generation, inheritance; and the criticisms that Forster had leveled against Kant's essay, "Determination of a Concept of a Human Race" (1785). Mensch shows that Kant's appeal to Blumenbach's "formative drive," in this context, is more strategic than substantive. Not only did Kant hope to "gain the support of the rising of the Göttingen medical faculty" (193) for his polemics against Herder and his response to Forster, he also hoped that Blumenbach would recognize and adopt the teleological interpretation of epigenesis that he presented in the third Critique (208-210). Mensch shows that Kant was largely successful, since Blumenbach later described his position as combining the "physic-mechanical with the purely teleological" (209).

Finally, in the fifth part, on freedom, immorality, and happiness, Paola Rumore argues that "Crusius' attitude towards the central topic of rationalistic psychology and the critique he put forth opened a viable path to Kant, an alternative to the dominant options at the time" (215). She emphasizes Crusius' critique of metaphysical proofs of the immortality of the soul (216-219) as well as his moral proof (219-225), based on "an internal striving (Trieb) to an eternal final end in finite creatures" and on the claim that "happiness," understood as "the reunification with God which rational and freely acting creatures achieve by means of virtue" is "God's objective final end" (219-220). Kant is quite critical of these arguments, particularly in the transcripts of his metaphysics lectures (see 225-231), but, like Crusius, he does provide a moral justification for belief in the immortality of the soul in the Critique of Practical Reason (1788).

Stefano Bacin addresses the conflict between Kant and Feder over morality. Feder is known to Kantians as an empiricist and a hostile reviewer of the first Critique, but many do not realize that, in moral philosophy, Feder's view was "the most important philosophical alternative to Kant's novel approach in the German debates of their time" (234). Bacin identifies three main differences between their positions: Kant's opposition to the empirical investigations of the will associated with "universal practical philosophy" (237-241); Feder's defense of an intrinsic connection between virtue and happiness (241-246); and the methodological differences between Kant's rationalism and Feder's empiricism, the former insisting the moral principles be derived from pure reason, the latter demanding that morality be based on careful observation of experience.

Heiner F. Klemme, in the last chapter, considers Kant's response to Garve's views on morality, freedom, and natural necessity and their role in the development of his moral philosophy. This subject is of particular interest, because the composition of Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (1785) can be traced back to Kant's plans to write a response to Garve's Philosophische Anmerkungen und Abhandlungen zu Cicero's Büchern von den Pflichten (1783) -- at least according to Hamann (251-252). Klemme indicates that Garve accepted the Wolffian conviction that "obligation and virtue imply freedom" (254), but remained skeptical about attempts to explain their relationship. Kant tries to refute this skepticism, and the fatalism with which he thinks it is associated, through his deduction of the idea of freedom in Part III of the Groundwork. Klemme also suggests that we regard Kant's remarks on Garve in "On the common saying: That may be correct in theory, but it is of no use in practice" (1793) as a "belated commentary on subsections four and five of his Groundwork" (262), acknowledging that it was Garve's skepticism that motivated Kant's appeal to the concept of freedom to "save the possibility" of moral imperatives (263).

Each of the chapters is rich in historical detail and carefully argued, so the volume as a whole is informative and rigorous. Readers will come away from the volume with a more authentic understanding of Kant, a more nuanced appreciation of his German contemporaries, and a better sense of the debates within which Kant's critical philosophy was situated. I think readers will also recognize that Kant, his contemporaries, and their debates, are not merely "of historical interest," since contemporary philosophers are still grappling with many of the same issues as Kant's predecessors, peers, and immediate successors.

[1] Here I would like to stress that I use the phrase "grand narratives" in a more general sense than it is used in Jean-Francois Lyotard, The Postmodern Condition, trans. Geoff Bennington and Brian Massumi (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984), §9-§10.

[2] Peter K.J. Park, Africa, Asia, and the History of Philosophy: Racism in the Formation of the Philosophical Canon, 1780-1830 (Albany: SUNY Press, 2013), esp. 69-95 and 113-131. Interestingly, Park points out that only an "extreme minority" of historians during the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries took the origins of philosophy to be "Greek" rather than "Oriental" (76). 

[3] New Narratives in the History of Philosophy, "About us," accessed July 23, 2018. See also Project Vox, "About the Project," accessed July 23.

[4] The absence of chapters about Kant's women contemporaries is noted by Dyck and Wunderlich, 14. But see Women and Philosophy in Eighteenth-Century Germany, ed. Corey W. Dyck (Oxford: Oxford University Press, Forthcoming). 

[5] Meier's Auszug has recently been translated into English as Georg Friedrich Meier, Excerpt from the Doctrine of Reason, trans. Aaron Bunch (New York: Bloomsbury Publishing, 2016).

[6] Mendelssohn's Morganstuden, oder Vorlesungen über das Daseyn Gottes has been translated into English twice in recent years. See Moses Mendelssohn, Morning Hours: Lectures on God's Existence, ed. and trans. Daniel O. Dahlstrom and Corey W. Dyck (Dodrecht: Springer, 2011) and Moses Mendelssohn, Last Works, ed. and trans. Bruce Rosenstock (Champaign: University of Illinois Press, 2012).