Kant and Milton

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Sanford Budick, Kant and Milton, Harvard University Press, 2010, 330pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674050051.

Reviewed by Stephen M. Fallon, University of Notre Dame


You may be one of the many readers who do a double-take when encountering the title of Sanford Budick's Kant and Milton. I predict that Kant scholars will put down the book convinced that Milton is a seminal figure for Kant, and Miltonists will put it down heartened by this evidence of the poet's influence and armed with a new way of thinking about one of the central debates in Milton studies today, concerning the meaning of Samson Agonistes. (A preliminary word to philosophers: caveat emptor; as a Milton scholar with an interest in the history of philosophy, I cannot claim anything like Budick's intimate knowledge of Kant.)

Budick, a prominent, highly regarded Milton scholar, demonstrates an impressive philosophical sophistication. The second surprise, after the title, is that Budick, a professor of English at Hebrew University, engages intensively with Kant scholarship and only minimally with Milton scholarship. He argues that Kant, who along with other eighteenth-century German intellectuals knew Milton well and valued him highly, singles out the poet as the preeminent poet of the sublime and, as such, as a crucial predecessor making possible Kant's understanding and articulation of the attainment of freedom and moral autonomy. For Budick's Kant, aesthetics and ethics are closely related. If Budick's arguments are right, then Kant's readers will have a new resource for tracing the development of the categorical imperative, and Miltonists will have a new and powerful lens to understand Milton.

In six chapters Budick traces the development of Kant's moral and aesthetic thought as it develops out of the crucible of the constellation of German Miltonism (Budick employs a methodology of Konstellationsforschung pioneered by Dieter Heinrich), particularly in agonistic dialogue with Herder. (Budick argues not only for Kant's knowledge of Milton in the original English but also for the central importance of Milton for eighteenth-century German philosophers of aesthetics, who quoted and paraphrased Milton in their writings, apparently confident that their readers would recognize the allusions.) The book poses as its goal an account of Kant's understanding of genius as articulated in §49 of the Critique of Judgment, "Of the Faculties of the Mind that Constitute Genius." Through six chapters informed by acute reading of the Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, the Critique of Practical Reason, and the Critique of Judgment, as well as recently published lectures, Budick works steadily and, given the difficulty of the material, with admirable lucidity toward that goal. While genius characterizes central figures in the intellectual tradition, and thus draws them together into a community, it is incompatible with mere imitation. Budick points to Edward Young, whose 1759 Conjectures on Original Composition was translated into German in 1760, for the distinction between imitation, which does not require genius and which can be achieved by following rules, and emulation, the mark of the genius which cannot arise from or be replicated by following rules. Young's emulation supplies the seed for Kant's conception of succession (Nachfolge).

In Milton, Budick argues, Kant found a predecessor to emulate. Kant was drawn to Milton in part because both were advocates of political liberty. More essential, though, was Kant's judgment that Milton is the preeminent poet of the sublime. In Milton Kant found many examples of the purest expression of what Kant saw as essential to the sublime, the so-called "aesthetic idea," that is to say, an image (1) that sets the mind in motion by suggesting an excess of thoughts without being comprehended by any one concrete thought, (2) that through a play of light and dark both represents and enacts an eclipse of representation in the face of that which exceeds our comprehension, and (3) that as a result draws after it an infinite succession of thoughts. The surfeit of thought and the repeated negation of representation induce the "momentary blackout" (36) that is the hallmark of the sublime. For Kant Milton's description in Paradise Lost of the flight of Raphael to Earth (5.247-87) exhibits the purest form of the aesthetic idea. The experience of the sublime in the aesthetic idea can produce, through the process of emulation or succession (Nachfolge), precisely that freedom and moral feeling at which Kant aims (44).

Budick distils from Kant's comments on "Nachfolge" in the Critique of Judgment and the Critique of Pure Reason a dynamic he dubs the "succession procedure." It unfolds when, in the presence of the sublime as captured by genius, one's own mind "swings" into motion and, in emulation of that prior genius, one can experience in one's own thoughts a pattern of succession of representations, each containing a negation of representation, and thus be drawn into the sublime. In that moment, any one of us can be drawn out of his or her individual and limited perspective, view the world through universal eyes, and in the resulting autonomy and moral freedom make one's own the categorical imperative. In this way, the experience of the sublime in art can have the most fundamental effect on one's moral life; aesthetics and ethics become mutually implicated. In the more rare mind of the genius, the result can be artistic emulation (not imitation, which is no part of genius) and the creation of sublimity in his or her own art. The experience of the sublime in the heteronomous aesthetic idea (an "example" drawn from a narrative and thus involved in or reflective of the contingency of experience) prompts and discloses an isomorphic, autonomous succession procedure that discloses freedom and moral feeling. Just as one moves from succession prompted by the aesthetic idea to an autonomous succession, so in the sublime a transfer takes place between the sensible and the supersensible, or between the particular and the universal.

Budick makes a strong case that Milton's sonnet on his blindness, "When I Consider How My Light Is Spent," informs Kant's thinking and even his language in the Groundwork. What Kant found in the sonnet is the transfer of "standpoints" or perspectives central to the categorical imperative, i.e., the transfer from the heteronomous perspective of the world of sense and particularity, which takes its bearings and laws from outside itself, to the autonomous perspective of the supersensible and universal, which internalizes and thus endorses and owns laws. In a remarkable reading Budick demonstrates in great detail Kant's knowledge of the poem and his close succession to it in his definition of the categorical imperative. As with much of the argument of the book, I don't have space here to do justice to the complexity of his demonstration, but I can say that Budick earns his conclusion that the elements of Kant's elaboration of the categorical imperative "follow every significant element of Milton's sonnet, [and that] Kant's way of explaining their integration constitutes a full and profound interpretation of that sonnet, especially of its transfer between standpoints" (158).

Budick lends an initial plausibility to his argument for Milton's influence by making clear the importance of Milton in eighteenth-century Germany. Kant was far from the only German philosopher to draw from Milton for an articulation of aesthetic principles and of the sublime in particular. One of the most engaging stories of the book is that of the hostile rivalry of Kant and Herder. While Kant and his younger contemporary traded barbs on their conceptions of the sublime and on their understanding of Milton, Budick shows that Herder served as a useful irritant, spurring him toward a sharper articulation of his thinking on aesthetics and pointing the way to a fundamental shift in his thinking. At issue is the role of analogy in philosophy. Herder accused Kant's philosophy of abstraction to the point of complete disconnection from the world; Kant accused Herder of pulling down philosophy by tying it to analogy and literary figures, images from the sensory world that would inevitably bog one down in the heteronomous and prevent progression to the autonomous and freedom. To each, the other's reading of the Miltonic sublime is an unwitting reiteration of the sublime of Milton's Satan. (Budick's identification of traces of Milton's allegory of Sin and Death in Kant's 1785 review of Herder's Ideen zur Philosophie der Geschichte der Menschheit is a philological tour de force.)

Nevertheless, over time, Budick suggests, Kant came to view analogy and literary figures as legitimate instruments through which one could pass to the autonomous without being captured in the heteronomous. The breakthrough for Kant came with his adoption of "storytelling" and its potential to make available for the "succession procedure" "tragic form." This, as Budick articulates Kant's formula in the Critique of Practical Reason, involves "the honest person in extremis" who, though having lost the incentive to live and the taste for living, "reject[s] suicide by regarding duty alone," and "achieves an inner tranquility that is the effect of a transfer of consciousness across the verge of sensible existence or life, which is to say beyond the limit of any sensible incentive or reason to go on living"; the person's attained "respect for the purely intelligible moral obligation" is "more valuable than life itself."

Tragic form, Kant believed, can be found in Milton's Samson Agonistes, which as a result can be employed as "preparation" for the succession procedure to autonomy and moral feeling. Where earlier Kant had scoffed at Herder's tying himself to analogy and story as limiting himself to the heteronomous, now tragic storytelling becomes a propaedeutic to attainment of the autonomous. There is an isomorphism between the protagonist's experience and that of the reader for whom the text offers itself for emulation in the procedure of succession. In each there is a "transfer from (a) the first standpoint in the realm of the sensible, where we see outwardly to (b) the second standpoint in the realm of the supersensible or intelligible where we do not see outward things" (244). That is to say, as Samson himself moves from self-regard through the emptying out of pride in his strength and through the loss of the will to live before achieving, in Kant's (and Budick's) view, the transfer from the standpoint of the sensible world and physical blindness to the standpoint of inward seeing of the categorical imperative, so for the reader the experience of Samson's breakthrough from the heteronomous to the autonomous can be the occasion, and the aesthetic image (recall Samson's darkness), for the reader’s own succession to (or achievement of ) autonomy.

Milton scholars will see that Budick's reading falls firmly on one side of current debates, placing Samson's final action unambiguously on the side of morality and integration with the divine will. Those committed to the revisionist reading that argues that Milton does not endorse Samson's destruction of the Temple of Dagon and killing of thousands of Philistines may be resistant to Budick's reading; Budick is certainly resistant to theirs ("Milton's representation provides no persuasive reason to doubt that Samson's final … act in the tragedy is in the service not of his own but of God's 'glory'" [221]). Budick's Kant endorses the majority "regenerationist" reading of the play. But this raises a large question. Does the fact that Kant took up Milton's poem and fit it so tightly to his own understanding of tragic form and its relation to the categorical imperative have any cash value in the argument among Milton scholars concerning the meaning and tendency of the poem? The answer would have to be, not necessarily. On the other hand, I take from the book a sense that the bar has been raised higher for the revisionist argument. My own reading of the poem has been altered by the powerful readings of Kant (and Budick).

In the final chapter, Budick offers a reading of §49 of the "Analytic of the Sublime" in the Critique of Judgment that picks up and weaves together the earlier chapters by way, in part, of an acute reading of Paradise Lost and, in particular, of the image of Jupiter and Juno in Book 4 and of the image of Jupiter's eagle and Juno's peacocks in Book 11. As in the earlier chapters, Budick ties down his argument for influence by identifying passages in Kant's text clearly alluding to Milton's poem. Readers of Milton, whether or not they are prepared to be interested in Kant, will not want to miss Budick's penetrating and subtle comments on Milton's epic.

Kant and Milton is clearly thesis driven in its reading of Milton's works. Even if one is not inclined to agree with Budick's readings of Milton, his book is of immense value for its definitive demonstration of Kant's reading of Milton and of Milton's seminal importance for Kant. I find myself inclined to agree, and the book makes good on its promise to demonstrate that Kant is one of Milton's most penetrating readers (Budrick explains, for example, why Milton famously exhibits no "anxiety of influence"). After putting down Kant and Milton, it is hard to disagree that "only a handful of philosophers of the first rank have left us such a rich collection of reflections on any poet" (5). Allow me to say for Budick what he cannot say for himself: only a handful of literary critics could have knowledge and penetration to mine that rich but ignored and largely hidden collection and make it available to us. This is scholarship and criticism of the first rank.