Kant and Parfit: The Groundwork of Morals

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Husain Sarkar, Kant and Parfit: The Groundwork of Morals, Routledge, 2018, 375pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138351479.

Reviewed by Paul Schofield, Bates College


That the ideas of Immanuel Kant may be enlisted to derive a version of ethical consequentialism is, famously, the core argument of Derek Parfit's 2011 masterwork On What Matters, Volume 1. It's a novel and surprising argument for a familiar philosophical view, but in the course of developing it, Parfit claims to demonstrate something positively revolutionary. Namely, he claims that three types of moral theory typically thought to be in tension with one another -- Kantianism, contractualism, and consequentialism -- may be consistent after all. Proponents of these theories are merely climbing different sides of the same mountain, headed toward a common terminus, destined for reunion at the summit.

But this happy ending is not to be, says Husain Sarkar. His contention, argued for in tremendous detail over the course of this book, is that Kant cannot be conscripted to support the consequentialist cause in anything like the way Parfit proposes. According to Sarkar, Parfit misconstrues and misapprehends Kant's arguments and insights throughout On What Matters, and thus fails to appreciate the magnitude of the chasm specifically between the Kantian and consequentialist theories. Of course, Parfit's idiosyncratic reading of Kant, as well as the fundamental differences between Kant's project and Parfit's, have been remarked upon since the book's publication. Commentaries by Susan Wolf, Allen Wood, and T.M. Scanlon included in the second volume of On What Matters (OWM) argue, for instance, that Parfit fails to grasp the way Kant's Formula of Humanity is intended to respect the value of autonomy, that Parfit's method of arguing for moral principles through thought experiments is un-Kantian in spirit, and that Kant's notion of a reason is constructed in a way that conflicts with Parfit's realism about reasons. So the claim that Parfit and Kant are not on the same philosophical page is a familiar one, and one could easily imagine a book that critiques Parfit's entire project by pointing out very broad ways in which he misses the Kantian boat.

This is not the book Sarkar has given us, however. Written in a style similar to Parfit's, and adopting a methodology that seems very much at home with the one found in On What Matters, the book engages with Parfit on his own terms. Dilemmas involving trolleys, lifeboats, and earthquakes, populate the text in One What Matters, and Sarkar confronts such thought experiments and hypothetical scenarios head-on in an attempt to show how a Kantian might take things in a direction different from Parfit's. It's a book, in other words, that critiques Parfit in a Parfitian spirit.


It's not immediately apparent where one ought to begin, nor where one ought to train one's attention, when setting out to discuss the whole of this book. Its arguments are many, their structures are intricate, and they are scattered throughout a lengthy and dense text. To list just a few claims that Sarkar defends in detail: (1) the ideal that Parfit reads into Kant's Formula of Humanity is one that Parfit himself fails to capture with his own rendering of that formula' (2) ambiguity about the roles of actual and possible consent in Parfit's account renders unstable his own version of the Formula of Humanity, (3) Parfit's Formula of the Greatest Good departs so dramatically from Kant's understanding of the highest good that it's no longer Kantian in spirit, and (4) Kant's arguments against the Golden Rule can withstand the criticism Parfit levels against them. It would be impossible here to reconstruct these arguments, let alone discuss them all. So I'll instead focus on an argumentative motif that runs throughout the book, which is that Parfit repeatedly smuggles consequentialist assumptions into his argument in an un-Kantian way, undermining his self-professed goals of deriving consequentialist conclusions from wholly deontological premises and of reuniting the three major ethical theories at the top of the mountain.

It was, Parfit maintains, a deep insight of Kant's that moral rightness and wrongness are tied to the notion of consent -- an insight that Parfit seeks to draw upon and develop in On What Matters. That an act's moral permissibility depends exclusively upon whether affected persons would consent to the act is deemed by Parfit to be insufficient, however, as a person might give or withhold her consent irrationally. But after modifying Kant's view in light of several thought experiments, Parfit ultimately settles on a principle of consent that says: "It is wrong for us to treat people in any way to which they would not have sufficient reasons to consent, except when, to avoid such an act, we would have to bear too great a burden" (OWM, 210). The problem for Parfit, argues Sarkar, concerns the grounds which determine whether a person has "sufficient reason to consent" or is being asked to bear "too great a burden." For it seems that as Parfit understands things, both are determined by "facts about human beings and human happiness or human welfare" (65). So when considering, for instance, questions of distributive justice, the answer to how burdens and benefits ought to be distributed will ultimately be determined in some way or another by such facts, and not by what persons consent to through the exercise of their wills. But now it's no longer clear that Parfit has adequately distinguished between a consent principle that respects the will of individual persons and a consequentialist principle that instructs us to bring about some state of affairs that realizes a particular distributive pattern. And if Parfit's consent principle indeed fails to distinguish itself from consequentialism, then it's neither particularly interesting nor particularly surprising that a consequentialist ethics can be derived from it (69).

Similar problems appear in Parfit's discussion of the Golden Rule, says Sarkar. According to Parfit, a sensitive and careful rendering of the principle "do unto others as one would do unto oneself" could be used to derive a form of contractualism that captures the spirit of Kant's moral philosophy. Using several thought experiments to hone the principle, Parfit settles on: "We ought to treat everyone as we would rationally be willing to be treated if we were going to be in all of these people's positions, and would be relevantly like them" (OWM, 327). A problem with this formulation, which Sarkar argues manifests itself in various stages of its development, is that Parfit apparently understands "rationally willing" in a way that presupposes consequentialism. For instance, at one point Parfit considers how a judge might sentence a criminal in a way consistent with the (reformulated) Golden Rule, and concludes that the judge, "should ask how they would rationally be willing to be treated if they were going to be, not only in some criminal's position, but also in the positions of all the other people whom their decision might affect" (OWM, 326). But in unpacking this notion of "what others would rationally will," Parfit focuses on the bad consequences posed by unrestrained and undeterred criminals. About this, Sarkar objects,

The important assumption in [Parfit's] argument is that judges must weigh the consequences -- on the victim and possible victims as well as on the criminal and possible criminals -- before rendering their legal judgments . . . If that is true, then . . . [t]he Golden Rule is no longer playing the cardinal role in the judge's decision as a ground of duty; consequentialism is. (186)

Thus, when Parfit appeals at the end of the book to the Kantian contractualism he sees embedded in the Golden Rule in order to derive his consequentialist conclusion, he appeals implicitly -- and illicitly -- to a consequentialist premise.

To give one last example, Sarkar attempts to show that at a crucial moment, consequentialist assumptions make their way into Parfit's defense of his Kantian argument for consequentialism at the very end of the first volume of On What Matters. A crucial premise in Parfit's argument is: "No one's impartial reasons to choose [optimific principles that when acted upon, make things go best] would be decisively outweighed by any relevant conflicting reasons" (OWM, 378). Now, one might object to this premise on grounds that it seems to suggest that in an emergency, a person is required to save five strangers over one's own child -- an implausible implication, at least according to many. Parfit attempts to rescue this premise, and with it his Kantian defense of consequentialism, by claiming that it is in fact consistent with the premise that a person be allowed to save her own child. But Sarkar points out that Parfit's reasons for claiming this are unabashedly consequentialist:

The optimific principle, according to Parfit, would not require that you not save your child and save instead the five strangers. It would not require that of you because while it is true that a world in which that principle is adopted will result in saving the lives of more children, it will not be optimific because 'these good effects would be massively outweighed by the ways in which it would be worse if we all had motives that such acts would need'. (267-268)

It thus appears that Parfit, in defending his account, appeals to the very sorts of consequentialist claims that he is attempting to secure.

Sarkar levels versions of this charge at several other places. The basic point should by now be clear, however. Parfit assumes the truth of consequentialism, launders his assumptions through Kantian machinery, and then produces consequentialist conclusions. But if this is truly how his account proceeds, then Parfit has failed in his task of deriving consequentialist conclusions from deontological premises, and also of demonstrating the compatibility of Kantianism with consequentialism.


In my judgment, Sarkar succeeds in undermining Parfit's account. But even a sympathetic reader such as myself is left with questions about the book's structure. Does Sarkar intend the book primarily as a single sustained argument, with interlocking pieces working in concert? Or does he instead intend it as a series of somewhat independent arguments, each undermining Parfit on its own? His writing in the prologue and in the introductions to various chapters suggests the former reading. The first 244 pages, he implies, mostly just lays ground for the principal argument to be delivered in Part IV. Part I, for instance, constitutes over a quarter of the book and is, he says, meant merely to, "provide us with a framework in which to state and evaluate [Parfit's derivation of consequentialism]" (xiii). But to my mind, much argumentative work had been completed by the time we reach Part IV. To return to an issue discussed above, Sarkar argues in Chapter 2 that Parfit's Consent Principle is actually consequentialist in character. There he concludes that, "If the Consent Principle plays a central role in Parfit's [derivation of consequentialism], and if a consequentialist assumption or constraint is already built into the principle . . . then drawing a consequentialist conclusion from those premises will hardly be surprising" (69). But this doesn't seem like an attempt to give us a framework within which to confront Parfit's argument, so much as it seems like a conclusion of a self-standing argument that itself undermines Parfit's account. It's fair to wonder, then, whether casting the early part of the book as a kind of preliminary that will work with other portions of the book to deliver an ultimate verdict serves mostly to complicates matters unnecessarily.

Indeed, it's also fair to wonder whether and to what extent some of the extended arguments are essential, and how exactly they fit together. Over the course of the book, Sarkar presents us with long and detailed discussions about actual versus hypothetical consent, Scanlon's contractualism, Rawls's contractualism, Parfit's handling of Kant's notion of a maxim, and so on. None of this seems irrelevant and all of it helps to clarify and undermine things that Parfit says. But is it all part of one unified case against Parfit? Would Sarkar's case against Parfit be significantly weakened if some of it were omitted? Would a shorter version of this book focused only on the points I highlighted above undermine Parfit just as well? I am genuinely not certain that I have the answers to these questions -- it's very possible the book needed to be just as complicated as it is. But then I think Sarkar might have done more to make plain why this is so.

The flipside of the book's being complicated -- and it's a significant one -- is that there's much to be gained by thinking through all the details of this project with Sarkar, even if one is unconvinced that every argument is necessary or is doubtful that all the pieces cohere into a single argument. Each section of this book is meticulously constructed and carefully argued, full of insights with the potential to intrigue and engage independently of the reader's concern with whether Parfit can derive consequentialism from Kant. For instance, just on its own terms I was deeply absorbed by the first chapter, which explores both Sidgwick's problem of how to reconcile moral duty and self-interest and Parfit's attempt to solve that problem. And I suspect that most readers, depending upon their particular philosophical interests and predilections, will find portions of the text that similarly engage them.


Despite Sarkar's having argued at great length that Parfit fails in his chief objectives, he professes great admiration for Parfit's work. Indeed, Sarkar predicts that On What Matters "will come to be regarded as arguably the greatest -- certainly the most fecund -- consequentialist treatise in the history of moral philosophy" (xii). It's only natural to find this a bit puzzling. If Sarkar is correct, Parfit systematically misreads Kant in the service of offering an argument that repeatedly assumes what it attempts to establish, thus failing at the very task it sets for itself. So what, then, to make of Sarkar's glowing assessment?

We get a hint as to what Sarkar is thinking when, late in the book, he says, "Parfit's argument is perhaps the most powerful consequentialist argument there is in the history of moral philosophy, but it has no deontological pedigree" (248). So the argument is powerful. It just isn't deontological. But wasn't its power supposed to come from its deontology? Doesn't the lack of a deontological pedigree threaten to undermine the whole account? For those seeking elaboration, Sarkar says only, "[Demonstrating the greatness of Parfit's argument] is an enormous task; and I am, especially with my strong deontological leanings, ill-equipped to undertake it" (248). On the one hand, the lack of elaboration here is dispiriting -- allusions to the greatness of On What Matters pervade the book, and so a clear statement of why On What Matters remains great despite its shortcomings seems warranted. On the other hand, perhaps the monograph itself, taken as a whole, can be thought to demonstrate the greatness Sarkar sees in Parfit's work. What I have in mind is this: It's clear from the outset that Sarkar has read Parfit with great care and has achieved an enormous and deep understanding of the text through repeated readings -- he reports reading it twice immediately upon its publication, and teaching it six autumn semesters in a row (xvi). At its best, Kant and Parfit: The Groundwork of Morals allows readers to meticulously work through Parfit's arguments alongside Sarkar, benefiting from his knowledge of the text's intricacies, gaining insights through his careful exposition and critique, and, perhaps, seeing the genius of Parfit's work through Sarkar's eyes. I suspect that for many readers, the value of Sarkar's book will consist precisely in this.


Thanks to David Cummiskey, Nina Hagel, and Susan Stark for comments on this review.


Parfit, Derek. 2011. On What Matters, Volume 1. Oxford University Press.