Kant and Phenomenology

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Tom Rockmore, Kant and Phenomenology, The University of Chicago Press, 2011, 258pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226723402.

Reviewed by Sebastian Luft, Marquette University


Tom Rockmore's newest book is essentially the working out of two theses, one historic, one systematic. The historic thesis holds that the meaning of phenomenology goes back before Husserl, the inceptor of the school to whom the movement is standardly traced; what phenomenology means has been carried out already by Kant and furthered by Hegel, but inaugurated by Plato. Plato was no phenomenologist; instead, he has set the stage with his theory of forms, which, in Rockmore's narrative, remains the basic schema that informs Western epistemology.

The systematic thesis states that the true meaning of phenomenology is a form of constructivism, that is, a move away from a representationalist epistemology to a constructive one. As should be clear from this phrasing, Rockmore's understanding is quite peculiar and not to be pinned down to Husserl, Heidegger, or Merleau-Ponty, but is truly instantiated in Kant and Hegel. Husserl, Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty, as the representatives of what is standardly referred to as "classical" phenomenology, routinely misconstrue the true meaning of phenomenology.

Thus, another way to phrase Rockmore's second thesis is the polemical assessment that those thinkers who are in normal accounts called "phenomenologists" have gotten the true meaning of phenomenology wrong. Its true significance for systematic philosophy can only lie, according to Rockmore, in its bearing upon epistemology, and as a form of constructivism. Putting this in terms of a critique of "classical" phenomenology, its representatives cannot meet the challenge of making a meaningful contribution to epistemology. This task is partly achieved by Kant and fully executed by Hegel. Hegel is, thus, the hero of Rockmore's narrative.

The book can be divided into two parts: a "constructive" part on Plato, Kant, Hegel (chapters 1-3), which lays out Rockmore's understanding of what phenomenology truly is. The second part, comprising chapters 4-6 on Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty, is "destructive." These latter chapters offer a series of polemics about how these self-described phenomenologists fail in trying to capture the essence of phenomenology.

* * *

To set the stage, it is helpful to lay out the overall strategy Rockmore pursues. There is no denying that phenomenology -- both in word and in spirit -- has existed before Husserl, and Rockmore is right to call Husserl on his claim to have founded phenomenology.  But one could defend Husserl by saying that he means something very specific by the term and by his lights would not consider Hegel's philosophy a phenomenology. This leads directly to the problem with Rockmore's method. For, before even discussing the classical phenomenologists, Rockmore has his mind made up as to what phenomenology is. Given the most general notions one associates with the term, it is surprising to learn that it is constructivism, nothing else.

Granted that we are all free to define and use a term according to our desires. Accordingly, if phenomenology is constructivism, and if the philosophies of the classical phenomenologists do not live up to this ideal, they are clearly not phenomenologists. But if the claim that phenomenology ought to be constructivism is taken as self-evident, there is no way to appreciate in a remotely fair way the true efforts of classical phenomenologists, since they routinely define themselves as doing the opposite of "constructing." Certainly there are different meanings of the term "phenomenology," and if other meanings are by fiat ruled out, then there is no way to assess positively projects that are different from what Rockmore has in mind. He shows indeed no appreciation of these thinkers; to the contrary, his discussions reveal a clear bias against them. His approach amounts to an interpretive imperialism that is stated polemically, at times even mocking the classical phenomenologists.

Thus, in the chapters on Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty, Rockmore measures everything by his benchmark of phenomenology, and the fact that they all fail comes as no surprise. It is beside the point to acknowledge that Rockmore might have a certain qualified point in claiming that the true meaning of phenomenology is constructivism, if one has a certain meaning of the term set in stone that a priori excludes others. But what is the basis for the claim that this particular meaning is the only correct one, when it is evident that it has been claimed by different thinkers in their sense? This is clear already when comparing the phenomenologies of Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty. But that does not mean that any of these, not to mention Kant and Hegel (and Lambert and Oetinger, or Levinas or Henry), has a claim on the term. They all use the term in their sense, and if there is no single underlying meaning that unites them all, why is this a problem? Only someone obsessed with terms would find this problematic.[1] Finally, it is, after all, possible to define phenomenology quite differently and also quite coherently, as has been attempted elsewhere[2], and judge Kant and Hegel by this benchmark. In this sense, I agree with Rockmore that, from the Husserlian perspective, Kant is certainly a phenomenologist avant la lettre. But to discount Husserl entirely on the ground that he does not adhere to Hegel's notion of phenomenology would be as unfair and problematic from an interpretive point of view. In the end, terms are just terms, and to insist on one meaning of a term and to judge philosophers for not signing on to this meaning is curious.

Thus, Rockmore's strategy reveals a hidden agenda, his hostility against what by normal accounts is considered the basic sense of phenomenology. For Rockmore, phenomenology is not Husserl and his descendants, but Kant and, most fully, Hegel. To prove this point, he ends up writing a diatribe. Rockmore thus sets himself up as the final arbiter over established thinkers of the Western tradition, who are, in Rockmore's account,  started on the wrong foot, stumbled along their paths, and ultimately collapsed.

To be fair to Rockmore, the thesis of his work is somewhat more complex. The claim is that phenomenology can only respond fruitfully to the challenge of epistemology by becoming "constructive." So let us see what he sees as the challenge of epistemology. To understand this claim, I turn to the chapters dealing with Plato, Kant, and Hegel, which are the most cohesive and structured of the work and display a solid grasp of these classical authors. Had Rockmore stopped after chapter three, he would have written a neat work on what he thinks epistemology amounts to and how Hegel's notion of phenomenology, understood as epistemology, is the culmination of a "phenomenological epistemology . . . [which is, in his] constructivist strategy . . . arguably the best such approach we currently possess" (213). Hegel is also superior to the current "Neo-Hegelians" Brandom and McDowell, which fare no better than the classical phenomenologists.

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Epistemology can be said to deal with the question of the possibility and justification of objective knowledge. In Kant, this question takes the form of how a finite subject can have such objective knowledge; how it can, from its finite perspective, refer to something infinite. To set the stage, Rockmore goes back to Plato, or rather Platonism, that is, the theory of forms as an epistemological position that addresses this problem. Here he contrasts the ancient view of accounting for objective knowledge through the forms with the "modern epistemological model" or the "new way of ideas." The difference between them lies in their incommensurably different explanations of knowledge. The Platonic theory conceives the forms as causing things to be what they are. But in this dualistic worldview, things, as appearances (or phenomena), are not the true being (the unchanging ontos on), but fleeting appearances. In rejecting knowledge as causally stemming from things as they appear to us in their ephemeral nature, Plato is in effect rejecting a rudimentary form of phenomenology as a "phenomenological approach to knowledge [on the part of the Pre-Socratics] understood as the phenomenal approach to the real" (18). Plato is interesting for Rockmore's account because Plato's move from a Pre-Socratic "phenomenology" to his anti-phenomenological theory of forms is later repeated by Kant, whose "phenomenological approach to knowledge, which arises out of his Copernican revolution, is a replacement strategy that reverses (or inverses) Platonism" (18).

The "new way of ideas" is based on the assumption of a causal relation between things and our knowledge of them. It is anti-Platonic when the causal relation is reversed. The new answer to epistemology is representationalism, a position widely held by rationalists as well as by empiricists. Despite their differences, they share a

commitment to a causal analysis of the relation of ideas to things. Following Descartes, the rationalists tend to analyze this relation from the perspective of the subject who makes a justified cognitive inference from an idea in the mind to the mind-independent external world. Under the influence of Locke, empiricists reverse the direction of the analysis in arguing from the mind-independent world to ideas in the mind (33).

The "new way of ideas," whether in its rationalist or empiricist form, is representationalism. Rockmore paints in broad strokes here, spanning Plato, Aristotle's critique of the theory of forms, as well as Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and others.

This account becomes relevant in the chapters on Kant and Hegel. Rockmore's thesis is that Kant's early position in "the critical philosophy" was representationalist as well, but that he moved from there to a "phenomenological" position, which is constructive. This shift is played out between the first and second editions of the first Critique. Chapter two deals with Kant's trajectory from his earlier, "Platonic," position to the later, non-representationalist phenomenological position. In the first model,

truth . . . is the correspondence of the representation to its cognitive object. The second model is not representational but constructivist. It presupposes the failure of the initial strategy, which is replaced by the view that a necessary condition of knowledge is that the cognitive subject in some sense 'construct' the cognitive object or objects (41).

Rockmore's thesis turns on the "break" between the first and the second edition of the first Critique. To this reviewer, Rockmore is overstating his insistence on the break needed in order to make his case. There is no doubt that Kant refines and improves his position in the second edition. But there is no evidence in the vast literature on Kant that such a major break may have occurred. To the contrary, Henry Allison has made a sustained case for Kant's overall transcendental-idealist position.[3] Rockmore treats this widely discussed reconstruction in some three pages, pointing out that Allison's position is nothing but a restated Fichte. What is curious, however, is Rockmore's contention that what Allison is defending in his influential dual aspect reading of the thing in itself is actually the representationalist position over the constructivist one, a reading which, as Rockmore quickly states without giving Allison a fair hearing, "simply fails" (54).

Allison's thesis is that Kant's move is from a theocentric theory of perception to a anthropocentric one. We see things not from a God's eye perspective, but from the position of our finite position and perception of things. The thinginitself is, thus, not something distinct from its appearance for us (it is not an ontological statement about objects), but the same thing seen from two aspects, the theocentric one, which is impossible for us to attain (hence noumenon), and the one we have, hence the thing as appearance (phainomenon). Quite apart from whether Fichte entertains a thesis of this sort, it is doubtful that this reading of Kant's transcendental idealism can be seen as endorsing a representationalist view in contradistinction to a "constructivist" one. If I understand Allison's intent correctly, the dual aspect theory not only does the work of validating Kant's transcendental idealism with respect to objects of experience, but also the much more important claim that we, despite our situated experience of the world, nevertheless can have a priori cognition of it, as demonstrated in the Transcendental Analytic. Hence, were Kant's interest simply in explaining how we can have experience of things as appearances, this would truncate his larger agenda, which drives his critical philosophy from beginning to late, whether phrased in representationalist or other terms, namely the question of the possibility of synthetic a prioricognition. In calling Kant's concern in the first edition representationalist, and reading Allison's defense as merely focused on justifying the dual aspect of the thing in itself, Rockmore is in effect misrepresenting Kant's driving intention from the beginning, as directed against Hume's skepticism. To reduce Kant's position in the first edition to being representationalist is, thus, problematic.

What, then, is constructivism, as the position to which Kant allegedly turns?  Is it correct to call Kant's position constructivist? Rockmore points out that Kant never uses the term himself (58), but that it is the concrete result of the Copernican turn (which was not already taken in 1781?). Rockmore defines "constructivism" as follows: "By constructivism I have in mind the view that a minimal condition of knowledge is that the cognitive subject must 'construct' the cognitive object" (ibid.). The Copernican motive as to the "changed method of thinking, namely that we only cognize that of the things a priori that we ourselves lay into them" (B xviii), is, in Rockmore's reading, the turn to constructivism. What is the textual basis for Kant's alleged "constructivism"? For it is rather strong to claim that the Copernican turn --which in Rockmore's words consists in "reversing the relation modern science succeeded through making the cognitive object depend on the observer" -- is equal to the claim that we "construct" the cognitive object.

What we lay into the object means, to Kant, that we can only perceive through our forms of intuition and categorize the object with categories of pure reason. The human mind is passive (receptive in its sensibility) as well as active (spontaneous in the understanding). As Rockmore reminds us, this "laying into" is also paraphrased as "the objects must conform to our cognition" (B xvi, Rockmore 60). Is this -- our "laying into" and objects "conforming" to our cognition -- construction? Contrary to Rockmore's assertion, Kant does use the term construction, not with respect to metaphysics, but physics when it follows the mathematical paradigm of construction. Earlier in the B Preface, Kant speaks of the "light" going up in someone's mind when he sees that, in constructing mathematical objects, such as the equilateral triangle, he "can only bring forth what he himself a priori thought into and demonstrated (through construction)" (B xii). But, Kant goes on to say, this procedure is much more slowly implemented in physics, and even more difficult in metaphysics, because the grip on reality through experience is lacking, since metaphysics is a priori. Hence, the "constructivism" that takes hold in metaphysics, after Kant's Copernican turn, concerns the philosophical insight that, in general, objects of experience "depend" on our experience and cognition of them. But does this mean that Kant is making the philosophical claim that wein general construct the object of cognition just as the mathematician and physicist do? Rockmore never explains in greater detail what construction means,[4] but instead repeats the claim that the Kantian critical philosophy as of 1787 is constructivist, "because the phenomena are constructed and hence can reliably be known by the cognitive subject" (67), and this claim is elucidated by the equally oft-repeated phrase that the subject "works up" the object, as in "the contents of sensory intuition . . . are worked up into the object of experience and knowledge" (ibid.). But what is "worked up" other than a metaphor? What does it mean to construct the object in the Kantian framework?

That Kant's theory of experience is inherently constructive was the Marburg school's interpretation of Kant. It was famously Hermann Cohen who claimed that what Kant meant with experience was the experience of the modern (Newtonian) physicist.[5] The Marburg reading of Kant's philosophy was clearly constructivist; what Kant allegedly meant by the "transcendental method" was a construction of the object of cognition, which refers to a priori cognition of the scientist in applying mathematics to nature, and where the a priori is no longer considered static, as it evolves over the course of science's progress. The a priori becomes, as Michael Friedman calls it, dynamic.[6] This was the attempt to salvage Kant's transcendental philosophy from attacks stemming from the natural sciences that were inimical to Kant's apriorism. In fact, the Marburgers make no distinction between ordinary experience and the experience of the scientist, or have no regard for the former. Modern science was already performing the Copernican turn, and transcendental philosophy was merely retracing the steps and making this tacit method explicit. This prompted the well-known critique of philosophy being reduced to the "handmaiden of the sciences" (stemming from Scheler, but repeated by Husserl and Heidegger).

In this constructivism, the Marburgers have been called, at times, "Neo-Fichteans" and the Hegelian elements have also been widely identified.[7] By adopting the constructivist paradigm and applying it steadfastly to the sciences, the Marburgers, with the exception of Cassirer, were thereby criticized as overly oriented to an active conception of subjectivity and to science, to the detriment of the concrete subject and its lifeworld.  They were, in turn, the target of Husserl's phenomenology and Heidegger's influential Kant interpretation, which reversed the Marburg tendency.

What is my point in mentioning the Marburgers? In his constructivist reading of Kant, Rockmore is, effectively, repeating the Marburg interpretation of Kant, although he makes no note of them. Had Rockmore wanted to find a real constructivism in transcendental philosophy, besides Hegel's, he should have looked to the Marburg school. These were the real heirs of Hegel's insight into constructivism, but they would have rejected the term "phenomenology" for their project. However, admitting this would have brought on a serious problem for Rockmore's narrative.  For it was this strong reading of Kant that led phenomenologists, especially the early Husserl and his early followers, to call for a turn to the objectin its normal, unconstructed appearance.

Thus, the call "to the things themselves" meant, predominantly, a turn away from constructive conceptions of objectivity and toward things as they simply are and appear in ordinary experience, making a renewed case for the unadulterated experience of the world.[8] One of the founding intentions driving phenomenology was precisely the critique of Marburg school constructivism. Acknowledging this origin of the phenomenological movement would have undermined Rockmore's historically erroneous claim that classical phenomenology should have anything to do with constructivism. In drawing a lineage from Kant's alleged constructivism, to Hegel's constructive phenomenology of spirit and to the phenomenological movement is a complete misconstrual of what was one of the founding ideas of this movement, which involved a flat-out rejection of construction.[9]

Contrary to the Marburg school, whose members admitted that they were not trying to interpret Kant, but to update his "spirit" and to defend it in the light of modern science, Rockmore presents his interpretation of Kant as actually doing justice to Kant himself. Kant perhaps can only be salvaged by transforming his critical philosophy into a constructivism. This was the explicit opinion of the Marburgers. But to call Kant a constructivist based on this reading of the Copernican revolution, and not explaining what exactly construction is to mean in Kant, is unwarranted from a textual basis.

In chapter three, Rockmore deals with Hegel's phenomenology as the most fully unfolded form of constructivism. Arguably, this chapter is the best in the book, showing Rockmore's vast knowledge of German Idealism, although he gets somewhat lost in telling the story of German philosophy between Kant and Hegel. He correctly presents Hegel , in my opinion, as forging a new form of epistemology by introducing the two important notions of history (as realm for the unfolding of knowledge) and system. Perhaps it is an overstatement that Hegel has dropped the a priori stance of Kant in favor of an empirical, even dynamic conception of truth as ever-evolving.[10] Yet, it is here that one gets a better sense of what Rockmore means by constructivism.

Pointing, arguably for the first time, to the way in which finite human beings in fact transform imperfect claims to know into progressively better and hence relatively more acceptable epistemological claims, Hegel invents a strikingly novel phenomenological approach to the problem of knowledge. (91)

What is phenomenological about it? Rockmore explains,

We know only what we construct. If in knowing we know only ourselves, then we do not know noumena. Hence, we do not know the world in itself, but only the world as it occurs for us within conscious experience. Since we construct phenomena, in knowing we know only phenomena. (96)

Hence, Hegel's constructivist epistemology is phenomenological because we know only phenomena, not things in themselves. The culmination of applying the constructivist epistemological paradigm to the world as phenomenon

lies in his conviction that, when we alter the theory by adjusting it to "fit' experience, then the cognitive object, which depends on the theoretical framework, is also altered. . . . If cognitive objects are not independent of, but dependent on, the theories about them, then a change in the theory results in a corresponding change in the cognitive object (100)

This sums up Hegel's novel epistemology as a constructive phenomenology. Rockmore now turns to classical phenomenology.

* * *

In this latter half of the book Rockmore's voice takes on a polemical, even sarcastic tone.[11] The methodological problem, stated above, is that his conception of phenomenology makes him blind to the real concerns of the classical phenomenologists. It should also be pointed out that the textual basis for Rockmore's assessments is rather slim. Regarding Husserl, Rockmore confines himself to the published works only, which -- as he acknowledges -- give a reductionist, if not skewed view of his phenomenology.[12] In Heidegger'soeuvre, Rockmore reads almost only Being and Time, and in Merleau-Ponty's, almost exclusively the Phenomenology of Perception. Rockmore is delighted to mock these thinkers as he goes through their continuous failures. But a more knowledgeable reader of their work will be at times baffled at his ignorance of the textual material.

In chapter four, on Husserl, Rockmore is right to emphasize that Husserl's starting point was the challenge posed by psychologism. Indeed, Husserl's search for secure foundations is fiercely critical of skepticism and relativism, of which psychologism is guilty. But he sees Husserl's work as a lifelong struggle that does not come to grips, ultimately, with psychologism (109). Husserl briefly reaches a safe haven in the transcendental turn, which Rockmore reads as a turn from representationalism to constructivism, but this stance as ofIdeas I, in which Husserl commits himself to transcendental idealism, is supposedly no longer descriptive (128-135). But Husserl cannot make good on the promise to construe phenomenology as epistemology. This narrative is, I believe, a series of misunderstandings,[13] which I shall discuss before sketching the contribution Husserlian phenomenology can make to epistemology .

Husserl's refutation of psychologism had solved, in his mind, the problem posed by this position once and for all. It is not clear whence Rockmore would get the notion that the specter of psychologism would reappear in his later work. The issue of the parallel between phenomenology and (phenomenological) psychology that Husserl later draws is meant to contrast Husserl's transcendental register to a phenomenology that has not performed the reduction. True, the very concept of a pre-phenomenological psychology has been criticized as a straw man. But to see the parallel as an indication of Husserl's fallback into psychologism is implausible.

Rockmore is right to point out that Husserl construed his phenomenology as rigorous science as a response to psychologism's (and historicism's) skeptical relativism.  But he neglects to mention what exactly makes his phenomenology rigorous, or what Husserl puts in the place of a psychologistic description of the mental. Husserl's solution is the eidetic project. Rockmore mentions the early stance of eidetic intuition, which Husserl himself refined as eidetic variation. Without this later addition one simply cannot adequately understand what this method is about. Thus, the solution to the conundrum of how one can achieve objective cognition of subjective mental processes lies in the fact that my subjective first-person experience is nothing but the launching pad for eidetic insights. I can begin the process of variation through imagination, for instance when I, instead of describing the experience of a house given to me in adumbrations (the front side visible, the back side hidden), describe an imagined house, which has been varied into a phantasy castle, in a phantasy world with me as a three-eyed dragon. The eidetic insight here is that even in this scenario I cannot but see the perceptual object with a seen front and hidden backside. The eidetic insight is the "cannot be otherwise" in the structure of external perception.[14] Phenomenology, to Husserl, is the eidetic science of subjective experience, where my factual experience is but an arbitrary entry gate to experience-as-such. Without this elucidation of what phenomenology as rigorous science means, it is not surprising that the notion of rigorous science remains opaque.

In general, phenomenology is a description of the way things in the world give themselves to experiencing consciousness. The paradigm of givenness, however, is not a fallback into a "myth of the given,"[15] but involves a complex relation of something giving itself and subjective "contributions" that make this givenness apprehensible. This process of the gradual build-up of the world in subjective experience Husserl calls "constitution," which phenomenology describes in its "subjective" and "objective" aspects, noesis and noema. The process of perception involves both something subjective (movement of the eyes, of the body walking around the house) as well as aspects of the house (the front side with its color and structure), which come together in the intentional act. Hence, "intentionality" is Husserl's term for the "immanence" of consciousness, which has bracketed the thing in itself (as well as the factual I), and focuses on the noetic-noematic aspects of consciousness in which the world makes its appearance.

It has been pointed out, and Rockmore is aware of this, that Husserl never fully clarified constitution and that he cannot avoid constructive elements in his descriptions. Indeed, the process of constitution runs from passive syntheses in perception to activity in which I will something or judge or perform an act. Rockmore nowhere mentions Husserl's crucial expansion of the scope of phenomenology from static phenomenology, which describes acts in their intentional structure, to genetic phenomenology, which traces the genesis of a current act in past acts and their sedimentations. In his genetic phenomenology, which reaches into the history of consciousness Husserl explicitly acknowledges that here the phenomenological ideal of direct evidence cannot always be reached and allows for (re-)construction of these past acts.[16]

But Rockmore makes out this move to a (re-)constructive level of phenomenology to be a break with the ideal of description, such that the early ("representationalist") phenomenology was descriptive, and the later stage, after the transcendental reduction, constructive and hence no longer descriptive. Nothing could be further from the truth. Of course phenomenology describes; it is primarily a descriptive, not a normative discipline.[17] But if description reaches into the genesis of consciousness, it is still descriptive, though reconstructive. There is no contradiction, in Husserl's mind, between the two methods. Moreover, construction means something completely different from Rockmore's understanding: it does not mean to "construct the object," but to reconstruct the intentional acts which are no longer present, because they have passed (such as the reconstruction of a past act through recollection). By ignoring Husserl's expansion of the scope of the phenomenological project from static to genetic phenomenology, Rockmore misses the point of what phenomenology, fully unfolded, is about, and the assessment of its being "constructive" is entirely misrepresented.

Due to this omission, Rockmore also misunderstands the meaning of phenomenology as transcendental idealism. It has been argued that Husserl's entire phenomenological project was transcendental from the outset. For the move from transcendence (the object taken as existing mind-independently) to what Husserl around 1907 calls "real immanence" is arguably already the transcendental turn from considering objects as they exist mind-independently to considering them as given to consciousness. The famous epoché and the phenomenological reduction introduced in Ideas I merely systematize this methodological move. The shift introduced here is from the natural attitude, in which things are taken to exist mind-independently, to the phenomenological attitude, which does not deny their mind-independent existence (which is merely bracketed), but focuses on the "immanence" of intentionality with its noetic-noematic structure. Hence, what Kant calls "empirical realism" (the epistemological position of the natural attitude) and the phenomenological position of describing the constitution of the world in consciousness, which as world-constituting is not natural but transcendental, exist alongside one another. Hence, Rockmore's claim that Husserl believes that transcendental idealism is incompatible with realism (130), is in clear contradiction to Husserl's statements,[18] where he claims that he has nothing to renounce regarding his shift to transcendental idealism, but that it is by no means a denial of realism. Husserl also emphasizes that despite his idealistic stance, his phenomenology is also the most robust realism, since it by no means denies the existence of the world, but merely focuses on its constitution in consciousness.

Because of these misrepresentations Rockmore overlooks what can be a contribution to the epistemological problem of clarifying the possibility of objective knowledge. The full shape of phenomenology is as an eidetic science of transcendental subjectivity. The project is to show the eidetic (invariant) structures of how the world is constituted in consciousness, from the most passive levels to the highest form of activity terminating in judgments. Hence, phenomenological epistemology shows how we get from "experience to judgment."[19] It is from this standpoint that Husserl criticizes Kant as having an aloof position "from above" rather than from below. The phenomenological contribution to epistemology, thus, is to show how scientific and in general theoretical judgments with the claim to objectivity have their origin in passive, pre-predicative experience. To reach into this pre-predicative sphere, construction is necessary, though it is not the only method, nor is it constructivism in Rockmore's sense.

Finally, concerning Rockmore's claim that epistemology has to be constructive in showing "how a change in theory results in a corresponding change in the cognitive object," Husserl would be able to accommodate this demand in his analyses of the plurality of attitudes which we can have of one and the same object, which result in different apprehensions of the object. The famous example of the house suggests that what it "is" depends on the attitude I have when viewing it, as a realtor, an artist, a homeowner, and so on. An attitude is not a theory, but attitudes give rise to theoretical considerations, when, e.g., the love of roses leads to botany. But despite the different attitudes I have toward the house, I do see the house, and the thing itself is nothing but the (Kantian) idea of the totality of all possible aspects and adumbrations. Thus, although I always experience through an attitude, I am in touch with things themselves. This is another indication of Husserl's realism despite his idealist stance.

Chapter five deals with Heidegger, and here, too, instead of engaging in the polemic, I will spell out what Heidegger's philosophy, as a hermeneutics of Dasein's facticity, has to say to the problem of epistemology. Again, Rockmore is correct in stating that Heidegger's position is a "non-representational form of epistemology" (141). But, according to Rockmore, this promising start is once again bound to fail because Heidegger's obsession with ontology directs his concerns only to the meaning of being, not knowing. Therefore, Heidegger ends up making "for the most part invalid epistemological claims in the context of his attention to being in general" (186). The reason these claims are invalid is that "one cannot isolate ontology from epistemology, since an answer to the question of the meaning of being must take up related epistemological aspects of this question" (ibid.).  Rockmore finishes Heidegger off with the ad hominem that Heidegger, who was the most erudite member of the phenomenological movement, "does not seem to have studied the problem of knowledge in any detail" (ibid.).

These claims reveal no sensitivity for the concerns driving Heidegger. The reason Heidegger makes "invalid" claims, or actually no claims, concerning epistemology is that he sees the Western tradition, as focused on a knowing subject, as flawed and not able to give a correct account of the human being, now called "Dasein." It is not that Heidegger makes literallyno claims about epistemology; instead, he sees the project of epistemology, as conceived by the Western tradition, as problematic ab initio. But this does not mean that he does not want to give a renewed account of the subject and from there approach something that was called epistemology but which has been displaced by an improved account of the human subject. Where Rockmore is dismissive of Heidegger's "neo-Aristotelian" stance, Heidegger in fact takes his starting point from a concrete "pragmatic" account of the human being as essentially active, engaged in the world, and primarily not reflective but immersed in its projects. Thus, the human being is no longer conceived as a subject that has the world parading before it, but as existing, being there (da-sein) and as such being-in-the-world. Dasein's existence in the world as Umwelt encounters "things" that are used without further ado (they are zuhanden, ready to hand or handy) or, as derivative of this use, present to hand (vorhanden)with the added claim that what the philosophical tradition has privileged -- the self-standing object vis-à-vis a subject -- is a derivative mode of how we normally live. This "pragmatic" reading of the subject is not an epistemology because Heidegger's claim is precisely that something like the problem of epistemology in explaining the objectivity of the object is derivative of a far more basic sense in which we live "first and foremost."

There are plenty of objections one can bring forward against Heidegger, but to say that he has nothing to say to traditional epistemology -- because he rejects the very ground on which epistemology takes its stand -- is like saying that Einstein has nothing to say to Newton: the two do not share the same conceptual framework, regardless of whether Einstein is an improvement over Newton, or Heidegger over the Western tradition. Heidegger would reject from the outset the very grounds on which Rockmore is interrogating him. It is fair to question a philosopher's position on grounds that one has established oneself; but there should not be any pretense of an objective and fair critique if these grounds are not only not shared, but flat-out rejected by the opponent. Rockmore's interpretive imperialism blinds him to any position other than his own.

As will come as no surprise, Merleau-Ponty is treated no differently than the two previous figures. I'll forgo a lengthy discussion of Rockmore's reading of the French phenomenologist. Let me just point out the most striking claims. For instance, the reader will surprised to learn from Rockmore that Merleau-Ponty cannot account for any universal cognition because he is focused on the primacy of (individual) perception, whereas Merleau-Ponty's point is, rather, to undercut a strict separation of I and world, individual and universal, through his thesis of the universal "flesh" that we are all part of. If anything, this is a metaphilosophical claim that is not meant to replace a traditional epistemology. Furthermore, Rockmore is far too quick to say that Merleau-Ponty rejects transcendental idealism, when his more nuanced project is, rather, to improve on Husserl's notion of transcendental idealism, as demonstrated in his famous claim, cited by Rockmore, that the reduction can never be "complete" -- but is nevertheless necessary and doable. Finally, one is baffled by the claim that Merleau-Ponty's considered position ultimately amounts to a psychologism because

the appeal to a view of the subject as always already in context as well as his appeal to psychology on the basis of philosophical claims is itself a form of psychologism from Husserl's point of view (198).

So, to claim the contextuality of the subject is psychologism? And, while Merleau-Ponty clearly relies on contemporary psychology to understand the nature of the subject, to receive input from empirical psychology to further philosophical phenomenology is not the same as to claim that the phenomenologist's assertions conflate the true nature of findings in the area of consciousness research. Husserl himself relied on cues from psychologists of his day -- though to a lesser extent than Merleau-Ponty -- and would not consider this in itself psychologism, as long as one keeps the levels separated.

* * *

In sum, Rockmore's Kant and Phenomenology lays out a form of epistemology, for which only Hegel can fit the bill, but from this vantage point he can only polemically look down upon the classical phenomenologists. But his polemic blinds him to any real understanding of the driving concerns of the latter, both regarding the problem of epistemology as well as their own projects, and thereby unfortunately makes almost no contact with their thinking.


Allison, Henry (1983): Kant's Transcendental Idealism. An Interpretation and Defense. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Cassirer, Ernst (1996): Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, Volume III: The Phenomenology of Knowledge. Trans. Ralph Manheim. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Cohen, Hermann (1871/1987): Kants Theorie der Erfahrung. New York: Olms (reprint of the first edition of 1871).

Friedman, Michael (2001): The Dynamics of Reason. Stanford: CSLI Publications.

Fulda, Hans Friedrich & Christian Krijnen, eds. (2006): Systemphilosophie als Selbsterkenntnis: Hegel im Neukantianismus. Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.

Gadamer, Hans-Georg (2000): "Die philosophische Bedeutung Paul Natorps," in: Paul Natorp, Philosophische Systematik. Hamburg: Meiner, pp. xi-xvii.

Holzhey, Helmut (2010): "Neo-Kantianism and Phenomenology: the Problem of Intuition," in: R. Makkreel & S. Luft, eds., Neo-Kantianism in Contemporary Philosophy. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, pp. 25-40.

Husserl, Edmund (1950ff.): Gesammelte Werke (Husserliana). Heidelberg: Springer (quoted as "Hua" plus volume and page number).

Luft, Sebastian (2011): Subjectivity and Lifeworld in Transcendental Phenomenology. Evanston/Ill.: Northwestern.

Luft, Sebastian & Søren Overgaard, eds. (2011): The Phenomenology Companion. London: Routledge.

Pippin, Robert (1989): Hegel's Idealism: the Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Soffer, Gail (2003): "Revisiting the Myth: Husserl and Sellars on the Given," in: Review of Metaphysics 57(2), pp. 301-337.


[1] Cassirer, for instance, employs the term "phenomenology" in the third part of his Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, dedicated to elucidating the "phenomenology of knowledge," and he explicitly states that he is using the term more in the Hegelian than in the "modern" sense (by which he means the phenomenological movement). But Cassirer has no problem fruitfully drawing from Husserl where he sees it helping his case, and takes no issue with Hegel and Husserl using the term in their own respective senses. Hence, it is methodologically much more fruitful to judge these thinkers from what they are doing with the term.

[2] Cf. the editors' foreword in Luft/Overgaard 2011. Here, we give three notions that define the spirit of phenomenology (the first person perspective, description, and intentionality), which we claim apply to all phenomenologists as of Husserl up to Derrida and Ricoeur).

[3] Cf. his classic study Kant's Transcendental Idealism (1983).

[4] In addition, Rockmore routinely places the term "it" in quotation marks, something that makes the point, which is crucial to his entire analysis, even muddier.

[5] Cf. Cohen 1871/1987.

[6] Cf. Friedman 2001.

[7] Cf. Gadamer 2000 and Fulda/Krijnen 2006.

[8] This point is demonstrated in detail in Holzhey 2010.

[9] This point is not invalidated by the fact that the later Husserl allowed for constructive elements in his genetic phenomenology, as I show below.

[10] This reading goes against, e.g., Pippin's influential interpretation (Pippin 1989).

[11] The phraseology reflects this: formulations such as these thinkers being "clearly wrong," "clearly mistaken," "simply failing" abound.

[12] For instance, Husserl's theory of intersubjectivity was publically available only in the fifth Cartesian Meditation, with which he was notoriously dissatisfied and which needs to be supplemented by taking into consideration at least parts of the three voluminous tomes of the Husserliana (vols. 13-15), if one wants to get a better picture of the dimensions of Husserl's thought on the issue. It should also be mentioned that these manuscripts from the Nachlass have been available in the Husserliana for nearly three decades. Indeed, every knowledgeable contemporary scholar draws from them (such as Zahavi, Mensch, and Mohanty, all of whom Rockmore cites).

[13] Rockmore makes a few especially egregious factual errors.  There is, for instance, his claim that the "two moves" from the natural attitude to the "immanence in consciousness" through the reduction and the correspondence between transcendental phenomenology and empirical psychology (130, which, by the way, are not exactly two "moves") are supposed to be similar to the relation between "subjective experiences and objectivity" (ibid.), such that Rockmore can conclude, that there is a "parallelism between subjective experience and objectivity" (131). This claim is confused. What is this parallelism between subjective experience and objectivity? The first step is a move from natural to transcendental consciousness through the transcendental reduction. The second point is that there is a parallel between psychological description before the reduction and transcendental phenomenology (after the reduction). But this has nothing to do with a move from subjectivity to objectivity.

Next, Rockmore claims that the distinction between noesis and noema refers "to the intentional character of consciousness [noesis] . . . and noema to its ideal content" (133).  But every intentional act has a noetic and noematic aspect, and not every noematic aspect (the seen front side of the house) is an ideal content.

On the same page, the same mistake is repeated, when Rockmore claims, "Phenomenology, understood in this way, is transcendental, or concerned with problems arising from an approach to experience as intentional, hence 'consciousness-of', with respect to eidetic essence" (ibid.). This is simply not correct. Every consciousness experience is intentional, i.e., ofsomething, but this content is by no means primarily ideal, as, e.g., when I conceive the Pythagorean theorem. It is the task, after having performed the transcendental reduction, to perform eidetic abstraction to ascertain, through variation, the eidetic laws governing my factual experience. The result is an eidos ("eidetic essence" is tautological).

[14] Husserl famously says that even God, if he had visual perception, would see the house in adumbrations.

[15] Rockmore points to the article by Soffer (Soffer 2003) to "prove" Husserl has fallen back into this myth, where this very article makes the convincing point that the critique of the "myth of the given" does not apply to Husserl!

[16] And it is also very likely that he adopted the notion of a reconstructive psychology from his Neo-Kantian colleague Natorp, as Rockmore acknowledges. I have traced this influence on Natorp's part in detail in Luft 2011.

[17] This leaves aside the possibility of a phenomenological ethics, which Husserl did envision. Husserl carried out expansive reflections on ethics or moral philosophy at different stages in his career (published in Hua. XXIV, XXVII, and XXXVII), which have received a good amount of attention in recent years.

[18] Cf., e.g., his Nachwort of Ideas I of 1930 (published in English as Preface to Ideas), of which Rockmore also quotes.

[19] Experience and Judgment is the programmatic title of book featuring the manuscripts, edited by Husserl's assistant Landgrebe, which deal with this issue.