Kant and Philosophy of Science Today

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Michela Massimi (ed.), Kant and Philosophy of Science Today: Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement 63, Cambridge UP, 2008, 204pp., $31.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521748513.

Reviewed by Konstantin Pollok, University of South Carolina



This collection contains the proceedings of the 2007 Royal Institute of Philosophy Conference on Kant and Philosophy of Science Today. These essays range from more interpretive accounts of aspects of Kant’s theoretical philosophy — “Why There are No Ready-Made Phenomena: What Philosophers of Science Should Learn from Kant” (Michela Massimi) — to very broadly Kantian views on facets of post-Kantian philosophy of science - “Invariance Principles as Regulative Ideals: From Wigner to Hilbert” (Thomas Ryckman). The majority of the authors are well-known in the field and contributed original papers.

The title of this collection appears to be a bit misleading. For ’today’s scientists’ here includes Brouwer, Einstein, Helmholtz, Hilbert, Pauli, and Reichenbach, among others. And the debates Kant’s philosophy is applied to neither touch on present-day genetics research where one might be interested in unpacking the at least implicitly teleological concept of information from a Kantian point of view. Nor does this collection include current debates in physical cosmology where the existence of dark matter is posited in order to explain background radiation and the gravitational effects of visible matter. How to understand Kant’s first Antinomy between the finitude and the infinitude of the universe in light of these proposals? And what about the other way round, i.e. assessing their theoretical framework from Kant’s philosophical point of view? Nor do they include current attempts in particle physics to move from a Grand Unified Theory to what scientists call a Theory of Everything where not only electromagnetic, weak, and strong but also gravitational interactions are to be unified into a single field theory. Here one might ask about the philosophical relationship between these concerns and Kant’s struggle for the unification of what at that time was called mechanics and dynamics, i.e. the objective reality of the mathematically graspable dichotomy of discrete and continuous magnitudes.

However, Margaret Morrison, in her paper “Reduction, Unity and the Nature of Science: Kant’s Legacy?”, convincingly argues against more optimistic Kantians (such as Brigitte Falkenburg and Klaus Mainzer) that any assimilation of Kant’s transcendental principles of homogeneity, specification, and continuity to symmetry principles in modern science must fail because the latter’s justification is ultimately ontological while the former, due to their regulative status, cannot in principle be fulfilled. Similarly, Kant’s concept of fundamental forces is essentially different from that of present-day physics, as Morrison summarizes:

neither the current approach to unity via symmetries as the methodology of modern physics, nor the ontological project of reduction to fundamental forces can be given a Kantian interpretation or justification. Although some empirical similarities exist between the two frameworks, it would be a mistake to identify these too closely, since any Kantian construal will ultimately locate the justification for the practice of unification and reduction not in the physics itself but in human reason; a view that seems decidedly at odds with the metaphysical realism implicit in contemporary physics. (61)

So, given its primary historical focus on nineteenth and early twentieth-century mathematics and physics, this collection includes illuminating essays on versions of a Kantian philosophy of science.

Massimi defends what she calls “Kant’s solution to the problem of knowledge” (9), i.e. Kant’s way of bridging the gap between the world and our views on the world (to the best of our scientific knowledge). To both scientific realists and constructive empiricists alike she attributes the view that “phenomena are empirical manifestations … of what there is”. (3) While scientific realists hold that science gives us — or at least aims at giving us — the correct understanding of what there is, constructive empiricists have science aiming at ‘saving the phenomena’, i.e. coming up with the best available hypotheses about observable phenomena. She makes an interesting case for the suggestion that Kant’s Copernican turn was, at least in part, inspired by Galileo’s model of constitutively inserting the notion of causality (moving forces) in order to gain a unified account of our experience:

To Kant’s eyes, the passage from Galileo to Newton represents the historical instantiation of what the regulative principle of systematicity commends. Via Galileo and Newton, Kant saw historically realised the system that confers lawfulness on an otherwise contingent aggregate of Humean empirical regularities. (33)

Although, according to Massimi, Kant was unable to translate this methodology into an account of “solidification, liquefaction, chemical combination of gases, transmission of light and sound, and even biological phenomena” (33), it might be worthwhile for scientific realists and constructive empiricists alike to question their common background assumption of observable ‘ready-made phenomena’.

In his subtle historical survey, Thomas Ryckman explains how Hilbert adopted Kant’s concept of ideas of reason “that transcends all experience and through which the concrete is completed so as to form a totality” (78 [Hilbert, 1926]) in order to elucidate his own understanding of invariance principles. But Ryckman also points out that Hilbert rejected Kant’s distinction between the constitutive and the regulative use of reason and retained the regulative use only since axioms can amount to no more than hypothetical or heuristic principles: “A product of the faculty of pure theoretical reason in its ‘hypothetical’ employment, the axiom of general invariance posits a regulative ideal of systematic unity, and possesses an objective but indeterminate validity.” (80)

Roberto Torretti (“Objectivity: A Kantian Perspective”) attempts to convince the reader that

Kantian objectivity is achieved through the doings of the human understanding, but the understanding is for Kant a handless actor. We ought to manage to consistently think of it as acting from a body in order to properly understand the presence of objects as pragmata, as the Greek founders of philosophy spontaneously called them in their mother tongue. (94)

But it does not become clear what could be gained from this account for the practice of present-day science. Moreover, Torretti’s claim that Kant’s arguments for a finite set of twelve categories are “prompted by his religious beliefs” (86) does not add significantly to our understanding of the problems related to those difficult passages in Kant’s first Critique. Similarly, from Kant’s claim that the notion of combination (Verbindung) is the only representation that cannot be given through objects but can only be performed by the subject itself Torretti infers that we are in fact in agreement with Kant if we see not only Kant’s own but any other possible categories as empirical concepts. It is hard to see how merely dismissing the (correct) interpretation that the categories are particular kinds of combination can compellingly help to free Kant from his table of the categories “as a millstone around Kant’s neck” (89).

In his illuminating essay on “Einstein, Kant, and the A Priori”, Michael Friedman reconstructs the transformation that Kant’s concept of the A Priori with respect to the relationship between (Euclidean) geometry and (Newtonian) physics underwent in the sciences around 1900. He illustrates how Einstein’s conception of the relationship between the foundations of geometry and the relativity of motion, or more precisely, his application of a non-Euclidean geometry to nature emerged from competing views on the concepts of space and the relativity of motion held by Helmholtz, Mach, and Poincaré. In particular, Friedman explains Einstein’s “delicate dance between Helmholtz and Poincaré” (111) as a critical elaboration on Helmholtz’ linkage between geometry and a theory of real bodies as well as on Poincaré’s ‘elevationist’ methodology in the sciences. He concludes:

Kant’s particular way of establishing a connection between the foundations of geometry and the relativity of motion … has not only led, through the intervening philosophical and scientific work of Helmholtz, Mach, and Poincaré, to a new conception of the relativized a priori, first instantiated in Einstein’s theories. It has also led, through this same tradition, to a radically new reconfiguration of the connection between geometry and physics in the general theory of relativity itself… . Kant’s own conception of the relationship between geometry and physics … set in motion a remarkable series of successive reconceptualizations of this relationship (in light of profound discoveries in both pure mathematics and the empirical basis of mathematical physics) that finally eventuated in Einstein’s theory. (112)

The aim of Hasok Chang’s paper “Contingent Transcendental Arguments for Metaphysical Principles” is to freely adapt insights from Kant’s work “to give them more immediate relevance to contemporary philosophy of science” (113). Contrasting his approach with Friedman’s concept of an historized a priori, on the one hand, and with C.I. Lewis’ concept of a pragmatic, definitional a priori, on the other, Chang sees a priori principles “as necessary conditions for carrying out certain epistemic activities” (121). He proposes a “one-to-one pairing of epistemic activity and metaphysical principle” (125), and argues against the impression that this kind of relationship is “too neat, artificial and contrived” (ibid.) by introducing two caveats:

First, the one-to-one correspondence only applies to the most basic epistemic activities; complex ones will require multiple principles. Second, in the principle-activity pairing, the metaphysical principle and the epistemic activity are mutually constitutive (ibid.).

However, Chang does not qualify any criterion for an epistemic activity to be one of the ‘most basic’. He rather gives a list of such pairs, including, among others, ‘counting’, ‘narration’, ‘intervention’, ‘identification’ as epistemic activities and the corresponding metaphysical principles of ‘discreteness’, ‘subsistence’, ‘causality’, ‘identity of the indiscernibles’. But it remains entirely unclear in what sense, say, ‘narration’ and ‘identification’ are two of the most basic activities. What about other epistemic activities? Is ‘memorizing’ one of the most basic activities, perhaps corresponding to the ‘memorizability’ of a given propositional content? Or, is ‘forgetting’ an activity, perhaps corresponding to the principle of ‘forgettability’? The ad-hoc character of Chang’s “partial list of activity-principle pairs” (127) can hardly be in doubt. Most importantly, however, it is difficult to see how such a list could do any service “to accommodate the problem of scientific change” (132), or at least any better service than Kant’s old-fashioned table of categories.

Daniel Sutherland’s essay “Arithmetic from Kant to Frege: Numbers, Pure Units, and the Limits of Conceptual Representation” is an example of the contextualization of Kant at its best. He knows thoroughly the relevant stages in the history of mathematics, from the classical Greek tradition up to Kant and beyond to Frege and his contemporaries. After laying out the basic features of Kant’s account of arithmetic — (a) numbers are discrete magnitudes, (b) particular numbers are derived from the representation of pure units, i.e. units that are qualitatively indistinguishable, © numerical diversity with qualitative identity cannot be represented by means of concepts alone, (d) intuition provides the means for representing numerically distinct indiscernibles — Sutherland turns to Frege and his contemporaries R. Lipschitz, E. Schröder, S. Jevons, and J. Thomae. He discusses their different views on the meaning and mathematical implications of the German term Gleichheit, i.e. similarity, equality, identity, or equipollence.

Yet, Sutherland’s main interest lies in Frege’s attempt to overcome the view that pure units are required for an account of numbers. This historical competition comes down to what Sutherland calls the ‘pure plurality problem’, i.e. that numbers must be general, or pure, while at the same time allowing for a diversity of numbers. Kant’s answer to this problem, of course, is his recourse to pure intuition. Frege agrees with Kant that a conceptual representation of qualitatively identical parts undermines the plurality requirement. But Frege denies the possibility of a non-conceptual representation and thus that space and time have primitive distinctness. Sutherland’s point is that Frege’s claim requires further argument. He does not defend Kant’s solution to the ‘pure plurality problem’ - “conceptual indistinguishability gives us the required generality, while intuitive distinguishability accounts for the diversity of these units” (162). But by working out in detail the differences between Kant and Frege on the problem of numbers his essay throws a new light on the history of the foundations of mathematics.

Carl Posy (“Intuition and Infinity: A Kantian Theme with Echoes in the Foundations of Mathematics”) analyzes Kant’s seemingly conflicting claims in the Transcendental Aesthetic and in the Antinomy of the first Critique respectively that our grasp of infinite space is intuitive and that we can have no intuitive grasp of an infinite space. He contrasts Kant’s account of the intuition of finite reasoners like us with Leibniz’ paradigm of God’s grasp of a complete concept and portrays Kant’s solution to the problem of our understanding of mathematical infinity as an answer to Leibniz’ theory of intuition. Renouncing the normative status of a divine intuition, Kant resolves that apparent contradiction, according to Posy, as follows:

the receptivity of empirical knowledge blocks any grasp of empirical infinity, and thus there is no infinite empirical object. Mathematics, like transcendental philosophy, removes that block; and so we do grasp, and there indeed is, mathematical infinity. (182)

Unlike the empirical sciences, mathematics is built on the construction of concepts in pure intuition, and the objective validity or reference of its concepts is secured not by the existence of some empirical objects but rather by providing empirical objects with (quantitative and qualitative) forms. Posy does not claim any historical relationship between Kant on the one hand and Brouwer’s and Hilbert’s views on intuitive grasp and infinity on the other. Nevertheless, his alignment of Brouwer’s account to Kant’s theory of empirical intuition and Hilbert’s account to Kant’s theory of mathematical intuition sheds an unfamiliar light on those early twentieth-century theories of mathematics.

Although this collection is a mixed bag, anybody interested in Kantian perspectives on recent debates on scientific realism and anti-realism, unification in physics, symmetries and invariance principles, and the foundations of mathematics is well advised to take these essays into consideration. Overall, their strength lies in the clarification of the historical trajectories leading from Kant to nineteenth and early twentieth-century mathematics and physics. As such this collection might even help clarify problems in the ‘Philosophy of Science Today’.